Rousseau's Platonic Enlightenment

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David Lay Williams, Rousseau's Platonic Enlightenment, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2007, 306pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271029979.

Reviewed by Neven Leddy, Magdalen College, Oxford


This book is an inquiry into the role of metaphysical concepts in the history of political philosophy, anchored by Williams' presentation of Rousseau as an eighteenth-century Platonist. Of eight chapters, four concern Rousseau exclusively with the others are dedicated to Hobbes and Locke, Kant, and finally Marx and Foucault. Chapter Two, "Materialism and Platonism in Modern Europe," outlines the immediate cultural and intellectual context for Rousseau's work, and is the most accessible chapter in the book. From Chapter Six Williams' focus begins to narrow to more exclusively political issues, which culminates in his closing discussion of Marx and Foucault where his focus shifts from Rousseau and Platonism to a broader emphasis on the role of transcendent ideas in later political philosophy. The chapters on Rousseau offer an extensive engagement with secondary literature and are destined to become an essential primer for advanced students or other scholars seeking a clear path through the sprawling scholarship on Rousseau, particularly from the perspective of political science or philosophy.

Williams additionally offers a very useful detailed bibliography. Both the text and the apparatus draw attention to lesser known works by and about Rousseau that will open new avenues of discussion in the field. There are, however, several curious oversights: Victor Goldschmidt's magisterial Anthropologie et politique: les principes du système de Rousseau is not mentioned, despite Goldschmidt's own Platonic framework for discussing Rousseau; neither 'Stoic' nor 'Epicurean' appear in the index; and the significant body of scholarship on Rousseau's stoicism is entirely overlooked both in the text and in the bibliography. Chris Brooke's contribution to the Cambridge Companion is one of the few sources on Rousseau's stoic heritage, which is an excellent place to start, but missing are standard texts such as Roche's Rousseau: Stoic and Romantic as well as French-language scholarship on the topic. This is understandable in light of Williams' approach as an investigation of Platonism specifically -- rather than ancient paradigms more broadly -- in the history of political philosophy. This approach also accounts for Williams' emphasis on Hobbes both as a foil for Rousseau and as a lynch-pin for subsequent developments in political thought.

Williams' thesis is that Rousseau shared with Plato a philosophical dependence on immaterial concepts, which he elaborates on the preface:

Here we see a combination of the metaphysical, ontological, and political dimensions [of Rousseau's Platonic affiliation]: the commitment to transcendent ideas as the ultimate authority for moral and political arguments. (xxvii)

What Williams calls Rousseau's Platonic affiliation is presented as encompassing matters epistemic, faith in god, the immaterial soul, and freedom of the will, but not an institutional affinity -- at least not in this initial presentation. His use of 'Platonic' includes Plato himself and those whom Williams quite reasonably assigns to a Platonic tradition including St Augustine, Ficino, Descartes, Leibniz and Malebranche. Williams does not differentiate between Platonic and neo-Platonic. He also bluntly nails his own Platonist colours to the mast in what might be called his "so what?" moment, where he gestures towards the beneficial wealth-generating aspects of materialism, but despairs over the ethical vacuum that results in undergraduate cheating on exams, performance enhancing drugs, corporate plunder, and genocide.

In the third chapter, on the Platonism of the Savoyard Vicar, Williams puts freedom of the will at the centre of Rousseau's objection to the materialist position. In the fourth chapter, he demonstrates how the General Will can be understood as a Platonic Ideal, or at least as a function of a Platonic Ideal. He makes a good case that justice is the fountain head of the General Will, accessed through conscience rather than through public discussion, and that this reflects Rousseau's concern that faction would triumph over conscience in the "marketplace of ideas". In this presentation, justice is characterized as an unalterable metaphysical prerequisite not only to the development of Rousseau's politics, but to any normativity whatsoever. It is in this sense that Williams presents justice as transcendent -- it is the absolute measure of all other things. In Williams' own words:

Rousseau's purpose in placing people under the authority of the general will is not to defeat or "replace" justice. It is rather to enable justice and make it binding on persons so that no one may violate its principles with immunity. (111)

Williams then offers a broad assessment of the scholarship on Rousseau's conception of justice in light of his own presentation of the General Will as an outgrowth of the transcendent idea of justice and not an alternative to justice. The fifth chapter begins with the premise that Rousseau provides the keys to decoding some of his own riddles. Williams goes on to suggest an elaborate correspondence between Plato's use of caves and chains, and Rousseau's. In this framework Williams offers his conclusions regarding the epistemic differences between the two thinkers, contrasting Rousseau's optimism with Plato's pessimism regarding our capacity to access the General Will. The sixth chapter is built on the idea of Rousseau's epistemic conviction that the degree of virtue required for the proper functioning of the General Will is in fact accessible to the average person. In this process Williams attempts to rescue Rousseau from the charge of tyranny, by demonstrating that this charge is based on a pessimistic reading of the Social Contract in particular.

Throughout this process Williams maintains a synoptic perspective on Rousseau. This has the disadvantage of treating Rousseau's corpus as though it were generated in one unchanging context, but is more than balanced out by Williams' comprehensive discussion of the entire corpus. This approach allows Williams to illuminate Rousseau's specific comments and passages with references to broader themes and examples from his corpus. Williams puts it as follows:

Rousseau claims to be unaware of how these fetters [from the opening of SC] were imposed, but the careful reader knows better. They are the chains found at the end of the Second Discourse… . It cannot be said for certain that Rousseau was providing us here the essential clue to decoding his system. It does however, appear quite suggestive. (130)

Williams employs this method repeatedly and effectively, reading the Social Contract through the Government of Poland; he suggests that "whereas the Second Discourse describes the enchaining of society, the Emile describes the enchained society" (143). Most impressively, Williams demonstrates that Nouvelle Héloise has a pertinence beyond the usual superficial references to the political economy of Clarens or the like, suggesting that Wolmar can be read as Helvétius, and that Julie's comments on Plato reflect Rousseau's gendered view of human nature.

There are two particularly commendable aspects of Williams' approach to this topic. The first is that when Williams takes Rousseau at his word and reads his work as a whole, he means it, and this exceptionally includes Nouvelle Héloïse. The second is Williams' welcome attempt to work through Rousseau's engagement with the less-canonical figures of d'Holbach and Helvétius. That Williams, himself a political philosopher, is willing to open his project to both literary topics and the history-of-ideas-in-context as fields of enquiry as practiced in departments other than his own testifies to the strength of his argument and his confidence in it. This interdisciplinary interrogation of ancient paradigms in early modern discourse has much in common with recent work on Adam Smith by Gloria Vivena (2001 [1984]), on Smith and Rousseau by Pierre Force (2003), and on Hobbes and Gassendi by Lisa Sarasohn (1996). The methodology of this enquiry is only nascent, and this volume makes an important contribution to further interdisciplinary developments in the field.

Williams' methodological structure for his argument regarding Rousseau's Platonism is to illuminate the frequent parallels in their respective works based on his understanding of Rousseau as an implicit neo-Platonist, whom Williams describes as fighting in Plato's corner in a continuing agon with the role of Heraclitus played by Diderot (90). He explains

Platonism can be of two kinds: implicit and explicit. Implicit Platonists rely upon transcendent standards in making judgments, but they do not necessarily declare or elaborate ontological commitments concerning their super-sensible existence. Rousseau, as indicated, clearly has such a disposition. Explicit Platonists, on the other hand, not only rely on such standards but also declare the ontological existence of the forms. Rousseau never makes such a claim. (116)

In neither the example of Rousseau as Plato nor Diderot as Heraclitus, does Williams offer evidence of their self-identification with those figures, and it is more likely that both Diderot and Rousseau would have characterized the materialist position as Epicurean. Moreover, Williams' presentation of materialism is narrow and, as a consequence, reductive; he identifies Diderot, Holbach and Helvétius, not incorrectly, as strict determinists -- but he makes determinism a tenet of materialism, which is only tenable in a very specific context of eighteenth-century French Hobbesianism, which might also include La Mettrie and others. Williams' presentation of determinism as a function of materialism certainly does not reflect the seventeenth-century rehabilitation of Epicurus in France, but it is nevertheless a reasonable presentation of how Rousseau would have read the threat of materialism: it may not have been entirely synonymous with Epicureanism in Rousseau's mind, but this distinction is a small matter for Williams' purpose.

Williams makes a good case for a direct transmission of Platonism to Rousseau, based partly on the undeclared but tenable premise that Rousseau accepted Stephanus' ordering of Plato's dialogues. The strongest formulation of Williams' thesis comes in his valuable presentation of Rousseau's "On Theatrical Imitation: An Essay Drawn from Plato's Dialogues," in which Rousseau comes closest to self-identifying as a Platonist. This chapter is particularly representative of the strengths and weaknesses of the book. Williams' acknowledgement of the epistemic differences between Rousseau and Plato is enlightening and convincingly argued. The Platonic prism through which Williams projects Rousseau reveals valuable insights into Rousseau's disposition regarding the human capacity for social evolution and improvement. Rousseau's gendered view of human nature is likewise refracted in a helpful manner in the same process (180-181).

The difficulty with Williams' framework of transmission is that it fails to address the distinction between Platonism and neo-Platonism, particularly in his discussion of original sin and free will. Williams suggests that Rousseau's relative optimism regarding our capacity to recognize "the good" is a departure from Plato. I would suggest that far more significant here is Rousseau's departure from Calvin's view of the depravity of human nature which is characteristic of the Augustinian tradition. Williams' point that this represents Rousseau's epistemic departure from Plato is an unfortunate example of a high-altitude approach to the history of ideas which overlooks the more immediate significance of his findings. What is important here is that Rousseau's epistemic position, clearly elaborated by Williams, is in sharper contrast to Augustine, and especially Calvin, than to Plato. It was certainly not Rousseau's disagreement with Plato that got him in trouble with the nominally Calvinist government of Geneva or the Archbishop of Paris. On the whole, however, Williams makes an impressive and largely successful attempt to discuss Rousseau beyond the confines of any one discipline, and as a result this book will be of value to literary scholars, historians of ideas, and philosophers as well as political theorists.