Rousseau's Theodicy of Self-Love: Evil, Rationality, and the Drive for Recognition

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Frederick Neuhouser, Rousseau's Theodicy of Self-Love: Evil, Rationality, and the Drive for Recognition, Oxford UP, 2008, xii + 279pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199542673.

Reviewed by Wayne M. Martin, University of Essex



Human beings love themselves — at least for the most part. It seems to be part of our innate constitution to have a natural concern or affection for our own well-being, to take a special interest in ourselves. That, presumably, is a good thing. It is hard to imagine how we could survive without this self-directed sentiment and the forms of motivation that it enables. Nevertheless self-love can also go spectacularly wrong in a dizzying variety of ways. The history of moral psychology is in part a catalog of its many disorders. Love of self can become the sin of pride; it can degenerate into (or fail to develop out of) an amoral egoism; it can balloon into narcissism. All too often it makes us callous to the needs of others or overly sensitive to their assessments of our worth — or both. It can disrupt relationships and become an organizing principle in degenerate configurations of culture.

Self-love is a major theme — indeed, along with freedom, perhaps the major theme — in the writings of Jean-Jacques Rousseau. Rousseau himself was intimately familiar with the perverse and destructive manifestations of self-love, both from his first-hand experiences of the flamboyantly narcissistic world of the Ancien Régime, and from his own famously tortured psyche. Part of his intellectual legacy was an incisive exploration of the sentiment and its powerful dynamics. In this recent book, Fred Neuhouser has provided an incisive exploration of his own: a detailed critical reconstruction of Rousseau’s account of self-love, both in its destructive and its constructive configurations. The research builds on recent contributions in Rousseau scholarship — notably the ground-breaking work of Nicholas Dent and an unpublished dissertation by Andrew Chitty. But Neuhouser offers a novel framing of the issues, makes important contributions on a number of controversial points, and concludes with a bold and original (if also somewhat speculative) development of Rousseau’s hints that self-love functions as a condition on the possibility of rationality.

The basic framework of Neuhouser’s treatment is constructed around the idea highlighted in the book’s title: a theodicy of self-love. For Rousseau, self-love stands, as it were, under indictment. It lies at the root of such a long catalogue of human vices and miseries that it calls the goodness of human nature into question. Here is where the theodicy issue lies: given the destructive potential of human love-of-self, how can we believe that human nature is itself good, or that the creator of human beings — if such there be — was beneficent? Just as the traditional theodicy problem calls for an explanation of the existence of evil in a world created and governed by a beneficent God, so Rousseau’s theodicy challenge is, as it were, to justify human nature, and the role of self-love within it, in the face of the misery self-love has wrought.

So framed, the device of theodicy may seem both antiquated and contrived. Should anyone really seek a once-and-for-all, thumbs-up or thumbs-down verdict as to the original goodness of human nature? What would be the point of such a verdict, and by what metric could it possibly be undertaken? Neuhouser does not do much to confront these concerns directly. He is content to show that the problem vexed Rousseau himself, and can be used — here with great effect — to organize and systematize Rousseau’s notoriously unsystematic and often paradoxical writings on the topic. Neuhouser’s exposition proceeds through an analytic phase, a diagnostic phase, and a constructive phase. The analytic phase distinguishes the basic varieties and configurations of self-love; the diagnosis shows how self-love systematically leads to ethical, psychological and social disorders. In the constructive phase the theodicy is completed, by showing first how a properly organized human society can in principle manage the dangers of self-love, and second how self-love functions to make possible some of the greatest and most valuable human accomplishments. We may not live in the best of all possible worlds — Rousseau himself was certain that we do not — but a better world is not in principle closed off to us by some essential defect of our nature. Theodicy in this way underwrites hope and forestalls despair. It might also be used to guide reform.

The most important and fundamental distinction in Rousseau’s analysis of human self-love is his distinction between its two basic varieties: amour-propre and amour de soi. Both of these terms might perfectly well be translated as “love of self”, but Rousseau uses them to discriminate between two quite different moral sentiments. At this point controversy begins. There was a time when the two forms were distinguished quite simply as the “bad form” and the “good form” of self-love — an interpretation that was advanced explicitly by Allan Bloom and Ernst Cassirer, and reinforced for Anglophone readers by the tendency of translators to render "amour-propre" in terms that have strongly negative resonance: vanity, egotism, pride. Dent’s important 1988 book offered a decisive refutation of this now-superseded view, arguing that the dangerous and damaging form of self-love for Rousseau was not amour-propre itself but what Dent (picking up on one of Rousseau’s stray remarks) called "enflamed amour-propre". For Dent, the challenge is first to understand the dynamics whereby amour-propre becomes enflamed and then to devise social institutions and educational practices that satisfy amour-propre in a way that avoids such an outcome. Amour-propre is not an evil sentiment to be eradicated but a dangerous one to be managed. Once again here there is controversy. A number of Rousseau’s commentators (e.g., Joshua Cohen) have taken the view that amour-propre is enflamed and dangerous primarily when it takes an inegalitarian form — when my love for myself becomes the desire that I must be better off than you. On this reading, the strategy for the safe containment of amour-propre must be the cultivation of stringent Égalité — both as a social and economic policy and as a preference fostered in the education of individuals. This view is rejected by Timothy O’Hagan and Andrew Chitty, among others, for whom inegalitarian amour-propre is not the whole problem, and egalitarianism of itself an insufficient solution.

Neuhouser’s proposal takes its orientation from Rousseau’s claim that amour-propre is a “relative sentiment”. To see what is meant by this we can start by considering non-relative forms of self-love. Amour de soi, on Rousseau’s account, is primarily concerned with an organism’s self-preservation. I exhibit my amour de soi when I seek shelter and sustenance, defend myself against threats, or flee from danger. At its core this form of self-love finds no need to compare my own well-being with that of others; in principle it is a form of self-love that could be entirely solipsistic — even if in fact it regularly requires forms of cooperation with others. Matters stand differently with amour-propre, which is intersubjective to the core. Amour-propre is at work when I find that I am not satisfied simply with a safe and secure home; I seek a home that compares favourably with that of the Joneses. Even this fails to satisfy my amour-propre until Jones himself sees (and I see that he sees) how well my standing compares with his own. Neuhouser:

amour-propre is relative in two respects … First, the good that amour-propre seeks is relative, or comparative; to desire recognition is to desire to have a certain standing in relation to the standing of some group of relevant others… . Secondly, amour-propre is relative to other subjects in the further sense that, since the good it seeks is recognition from others, its satisfaction requires — indeed consists in — the opinions of one’s fellow beings. Amour-propre is relative in this second sense, then, because its aim — recognition from others — is inherently social in character. (32-33)

As both the language and the position here make clear, Neuhouser’s Rousseau is a kind of proto-Hegelian — the citizen of Geneva who thinks in German. For Neuhouser, amour-propre simply is the desire for recognition from others, a need which for human beings is every bit as basic as the need for food and shelter. Where that need is not satisfied (or is satisfied inappropriately) the desire becomes enflamed, and recognition is accordingly sought at virtually any cost — with morally and socially disastrous results. Recognition is pursued through a strategy of domination; the appearance of worth is valued over actual worth; relative standing is achieved by undermining the well-being of others; freedom itself is sacrificed in order to obtain status.

Matters need not turn out that way. Human affairs and human society can in principle be so ordered to accommodate the need for recognition without incurring these costs. But for this merely egalitarian considerations will not suffice. This is not to deny that egalitarian ideals form part of the Rousseauian picture. In particular, the principle of equal respect (both as a narrowly legal doctrine but also in more broadly moral terms) is crucial to the stability of the Rousseauian order. Nevertheless the desire for recognition by others goes beyond anything that equality itself can guarantee. Moreover, on Neuhouser’s reading, it will often require significant inegalitarian structures. The healthy satisfaction of amour propre may, for instance, involve institutions and practices whereby individuals can pursue their passion for being recognized as the best in a certain domain — an ambition that is one of the first manifestations of amour-propre in Rousseau’s state of nature narrative, and that both Rousseau and Neuhouser credit in many of mankind’s greatest accomplishments. Individuals will characteristically seek out forms of personal relationship in which they can be valued above all others in the eyes of their beloved. If society is suitably ordered and educational practices suitably reformed, the desire for recognition can be satisfied without the widespread vice and misery that it has so often incurred. Human nature is to that extent vindicated.

No doubt there will be certain familiar complaints leveled against Neuhouser’s account. Historical purists may bristle at the freely anachronistic use of Hegelian conceptual resources and themes from the psychoanalytic tradition in reconstructing Rousseau’s position. But Neuhouser is careful to mark clearly where he introduces resources from beyond Rousseau’s corpus, and to justify his strategy in doing so with careful documentation of what is present (and what is missing!) from Rousseau’s own arguments. Political realists, who seem of late to be in the ascendancy, may take issue with the openly utopian character of the position Neuhouser finds in Rousseau, particularly since so little attention is paid to the problem of how to get there from here. Neuhouser himself never tackles this objection explicitly, but one might in this instance justify utopian strategies of analysis as useful tools (not ends-in-themselves) for thinking through the nature of human needs and desires by appeal to the circumstances under which they might be fulfilled. I myself was not entirely satisfied by the closing argument of the book, where Neuhouser seeks to show that amour-propre is a condition on the possibility of rationality. The discussion of this point is certainly not without interest, but its import is sharply restricted by the Rousseauian definition of rationality, which effectively “identifies reason with the standpoint of the citizen” (192). Adopting the standpoint of reason is by this path intrinsically linked to submission to the general will, and thereby in turn to the recognitional dynamics that Neuhouser associates with amour-propre. But the initial characterisation of reason in this account too quickly serves to exclude the contested possibility: a rational but solipsistic individual.

Perhaps the greatest shortcoming here (in a book of very few) is the relatively short shrift that is given to the moral and psychological structure of amour de soi. There is now an increasingly dominant consensus that Rousseau’s theory of human motivation turns on his distinction between two essential and equally ineradicable forms of self-love. In the recent scholarship, however, amour de soi has played second fiddle to amour-propre, which is seen as the interesting, complex, dangerous and distinctively human variety. In this respect Neuhouser’s treatment follows the trend. This is to miss something important, both in terms of the complexities of human self-love and as regards Rousseau’s far-reaching contributions to our understanding of them.

To see the texture of the issues here, the initial question to ask concerns the object of amour de soi. What exactly is this ‘self’ that amour de soi loves? Neuhouser approaches this question by asking in the first instance about the goods that self-love seeks. This approach is sound, at least as far as it goes. Recall that, on Neuhouser’s account, amour propre was defined primarily in terms of the good of recognition. So what about amour de soi? Neuhouser’s first-pass answer follows one of Rousseau’s rough approximations: amour de soi seeks self-preservation. But this by itself cannot suffice for its analysis, as Neuhouser himself seems to acknowledge in a footnote, for it leaves open the question about what is involved in the survival or preservation of the self (30 n3). Is mere biological survival of the individual organism sufficient to satisfy amour de soi? Is it even necessary? (Suppose a parent sacrifices its own life to ensure the survival of its genetic progeny. Could this be understood as a form of self-preservation?) A human body is constantly undergoing changes; a human mind and character exhibits its own characteristic forms of ‘motion’. Since there is no static self to endure, we need some way of distinguishing the forms of change that amount to self-perpetuation.

On just this point our understanding of Rousseau’s position can profit by supplementing Neuhouser’s essentially retrospective reading (a reading that approaches Rousseau from the perspective of Kant, Hegel, Marx and Freud) with the view from the other historical side. It was the view of the Stoics that the object of self-love (not just in humans but in living things generally) was the constitution of the organism. Seneca (from whom Rousseau himself regularly plagiarized) defined the constitution as “the ruling power of the soul”; it was held to be that part of an animal’s nature that governed the proper cooperation of the parts of an organism as a well-functioning mereological totality. The “parts” in question are both spatial and temporal. Organs and limbs are spatial parts; life-phases of the organism are temporal parts — all working in combination to form a complex, spatio-temporally extended whole. Self-love, the Stoics argued, must thus always be informed by some implicit understanding of this complex constitution. (See for instance Seneca’s famous “Letter on Instinct in Animals”, a text certainly known to Rousseau.)

Rousseau’s understanding of human self-love was deeply informed by the Stoic position, but with a decisive difference. For the Stoics, the constitution of a human being, like the constitution of any animal, was something simply given: an innate endowment established by God or Nature. It is thus in no sense up to me to decide what my constitution amounts to. Rousseau rejected this assumption, and in so doing radicalized and modernized the Stoic approach. For him, the fitting together of the various parts of a life into a single whole is, for human beings, a problem, and one that must be addressed by the human individual himself. It is only in answering the question “What am I?” (the first and overarching question in Rousseau’s confessional enterprise) that we can know what it is to persevere as a self and as an object of self-love. To follow this path is to broach a new set of questions about Rousseau’s texts and about the fulfillment of human self-love. How does human amour de soi differ from its animal counterparts? What is the role of autobiographical self-consciousness in the construction of the human self, and what are the standards of success in such undertakings? To what extent does human amour de soi itself depend on an Other to serve as witness, audience or judge? These are issues that form part of the larger story of Rousseau’s theory of self-love, but they are largely overlooked in this otherwise exemplary study.