Rousseau's Theory of Freedom

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Matthew Simpson, Rousseau's Theory of Freedom, Continuum, 2006, 124pp., $120.00 (pbk), ISBN 0826486401.

Reviewed by Nicholas Dent, University of Birmingham U.K.


It is still fairly uncommon for book length critical assessments of Rousseau's work to concentrate on one theme or notion in his thinking rather than taking a broader canvas, but the gains in detail of assessment and depth of analysis are often significant. Simpson's book certainly bears this out, even though it is comparatively brief. The title of the book slightly misleads; although it is called Rousseau's Theory of Freedom its purpose, Simpson says, is in fact "to explain the theory of freedom developed by Jean-Jacques Rousseau in his work The Social Contract" (ix). So the focus is even tighter, although from time to time, and for good reason, Simpson has to look outside The Social Contract to explain or develop his points, most particularly to the Second Discourse (on Inequality) and to Emile, though one or two other pieces of Rousseau's also receive glancing mention.

Simpson contends that there are to be found in The Social Contract "four different kinds of freedom that are relevant to politics, yet the nature of each, their relative importance, and their relationship to the social contract after which the work was named are all far from clear" (1). These four are: natural freedom, civil freedom, democratic freedom and moral freedom, and Simpson sets out to consider, as noted, the nature of each of these, how they stand to one another and to the social contact itself. He adds that he is "not primarily concerned with the metaphysical problem of freewill" (ix) though he does discuss Rousseau's engagement with this on a couple of occasions with some incisiveness and clarity, despite not pursuing the matter to its end (see 61-6 and 98-100). Simpson says that the central topic of The Social Contract is "how people might construct a genuinely free political society" (ix, again) and it is plausible to hold that this is so given Rousseau's own famous formulation of the "problem" to which the social contract is the solution, which says that the members of the political community must "remain as free as before". However, there is something slightly odd in how this claim comports with several of the remarks Simpson makes later on in the book. For instance, he writes in the Conclusion (Chapter 6)

Another important feature of his [Rousseau's] theory of freedom is that the people he described entering the social pact do not do so in order to be free, at least not in the usual sense of the word… .The three forms of freedom that he discussed are a kind of happy consequence of the terms of the social pact; but they are neither the citizens' motivation for entering the contract nor the purpose of the contract itself. (110-111, and there are several other remarks to the same effect)

Whilst there is no real inconsistency here, his initial statement of what the "central topic" is generates a somewhat misleading expectation about the form his assessment of the main structure of the argument of The Social Contract will take. What is really in the driver's seat is the account of the basis for and the nature and consequences of the social pact (contract) itself: that "each alienates all under the direction of the common benefit" as he succinctly puts it at one point (105). And, as indicated in the previous quotation, the freedoms that emerge are "happy consequences" of this.

Simpson's discussion thus begins, in Chapter 1, with a treatment of the state of nature as Rousseau conceives of it, this providing "a theory of human nature and human motivation, which served as the basis of his account of the social contract"(7). He notes, quite rightly, that the text of The Social Contract itself says very little about the conditions under which the contract is made, and he turns, again in my estimation quite rightly, to Rousseau's Second Discourse to supplement this, carefully (almost too much so) considering the legitimacy of doing so. He takes from the Second Discourse the view that the state of nature as Rousseau deploys this in the argument of The Social Contract does not comprise the simple life of independent "savages" but involves men driven by amour-propre (which he translates, not altogether convincingly, as "vanity") with the consequent ambition, greed and the desire to do others down, leading to violence and conflict. Indeed, he goes so far as to say that humanity does not leave the "general" state of nature (as opposed to the simpler "pure" state of nature) even when "moral relations such as families or commerce" obtain but only when it enters political society (17). I shall return to this point towards the end of this review.

In Chapter 2 Simpson discusses the social pact which institutes political society.

[T]he basic question of The Social Contract concerns the terms under which such a union [of persons for the purpose of peace and mutual aid] would be rational for people of this kind in the conditions stipulated (29),

that is, people in a condition of sustained conflict who seek a way to remedy the drawbacks to their lives. He cogently defends Rousseau's view that the social pact requires, in Rousseau's own words, "total alienation of each associate with all of his rights to the whole community", noting that if the forfeiture (alienation) were only partial then there would be no way of resolving disputes over "which powers and possessions the public good requires them to forfeit" (34). The subordination involved in this alienation is to the community as a whole, not to any individual or faction, and Simpson argues, again very clearly, that the alarm this talk of forfeiture often arouses is properly allayed by Rousseau's provisions. A number of the most tricky and intricate problems in the interpretation of Rousseau's thought come up in connection with this cluster of issues, and whilst Simpson does not, and could not without getting deflected from his main purpose, address all of these, a cogent and defensible overall account emerges. "[T]he associates to the social contract agree to subordinate themselves to the good of the community" (44), that good being determined by the sovereign, which comprises all of those party to the social pact, declaring its will, which is the general will for the good of the community. Simpson doesn't spell out in much detail what he takes this "good of the community" to comprise in Rousseau's estimation, sometimes talking in fairly broad terms of the preservation of the lives and possessions of the members of the community, but sometimes giving much more specificity talking of "principles of equality, justice and duty to which the community has bound itself" (107). For reasons I will discuss later, it would I think have been helpful if Simpson had delved a bit deeper into what the content of the idea of the good of the community was and how it met the needs of those who are party to the social pact.

These two opening chapters provide "the context for understanding Rousseau's theory of freedom" (48), and Simpson now turns to consider civil freedom (in Chapter 3), democratic freedom (in Chapter 4) and moral freedom (in Chapter 5). Rousseau's view of civil freedom comprises, according to Simpson, "the absence of impediments to pursuing one's ends in cases where the law is silent" (52), and he does an effective job in arguing that whilst the sovereign decides what is or isn't to be regulated by law this doesn't evacuate the idea, nor the actuality, of civil liberty of any content. This is because the sovereign can only legislate on matters that affect the good of the community as a whole:

Since the laws must be ratified by the people as a whole, and since they must be perfectly general, there is no point in making them overly burdensome because the associates would thereby only burden themselves. (55-6)

This chapter struck me overall as a model of good sense and balanced interpretation. I should add that in it Simpson also gives his account of "natural freedom", which is unproblematic in this context.

The issue of democratic freedom appears less tractable however, and Simpson is very open that Rousseau's arguments for saying that "the people themselves should determine the rules … that they must make their own laws in person" (72) appear less than compelling for all that this was plainly something that he held to be very important. He criticises at some length the attempt to use Condorcet's "jury theorem" to defend Rousseau's view that sovereign decisions cannot be delegated to representatives. I will pass over the details here since, as Simpson says, Rousseau's complaint about the absence of direct, participative ratification of law is not that the law is likely to be an ill-judged one, but that it will be an illegitimate one, wanting in proper authority. Simpson's own account doesn't, however, obviously address this point either. He argues that if the whole community were to delegate its sovereign powers to some person or representative body it would only be rational to do so if it were certain that this person or body "would reach the same decisions as the whole community would have reached meeting in assembly" (80-1). This, Simpson goes on, makes representatives redundant, but this isn't the same as arguing that their determinations would be illegitimate. This chapter also includes an interesting discussion of Benjamin Constant's essay: "The Liberty of the Ancients Compared with that of the Moderns" (86-90), in which Constant argues that Rousseau was more interested in freedom as comprising collective self-rule than he was in individual rights. I think this line of thought would bear further development; in acquiring the relevant knowledge and skills and in taking up the responsibilities involved in collective self-rule, persons take charge of their lives and affairs in a way that rule by others, however fair and scrupulous that may be, denies to them. This is, for instance, something that is heavily stressed in Emile's education as he moves to maturity and full manhood, and while I should agree that the resources to develop this way of engaging with the matter aren't ready to hand in the text of The Social Contract it may be proper to look outside that to help with coming to grips with it, as Simpson does in connection with other points.

The chapter on moral freedom strikes me as the most challenging and interesting in the book, while being the one with which I most want to take issue. Simpson writes that Rousseau "defined moral freedom as autonomy, or 'obedience to the law that one has prescribed to oneself'" (92), though to illustrate this idea he gives an example of an alcoholic who is said not to possess moral freedom "because he is unable to live according to his own judgment about what is good "(ibid.). There may seem to be only a small difference between "obedience to a law one has prescribed to oneself" and living "according to his own judgment about what is good" but, as will be seen in a moment, quite a lot hangs on it.

Simpson goes on to argue that according to Rousseau there is only one law that a person can legislate for himself, the social pact itself, i.e. the alienation of all powers, rights and possessions under the direction of the common benefit; this is "the law that each person erects over himself or herself" (105). In so doing, they leave behind the state of nature in which "there is only one thing that might serve as the principle or guide of their actions … their passions or desires" (95). Instead, they ask themselves "'What am I supposed to do based on the terms of the social pact, which I have legislated for myself?'" (96). The nature of their agency is changed; people now follow a rule rather than their particular inclinations. "[E]veryone in the state of nature is a slave, in the sense of not being a moral agent and not possessing moral freedom. Thus there is reason to say that moral freedom is the most important kind of freedom that political society offers because it changes the kind of being that humanity is, making it morally significant and so apart from and above the rest of nature" (97). This has very plain Kantian overtones and Simpson carefully discusses for instance Cassirer's attempt to co-opt Rousseau to Kant's account of human goodness in terms of voluntary surrender to an ethical law showing, entirely effectively I think, that for Rousseau (on the account of his views we are currently considering) acceptance of the social pact is motivated by prudence, a passion for individual well-being, rather than being a "spontaneous dictate of human subjectivity"(104-5). But, nevertheless, a striking separation of natural man from citizen, of a- (or non-)morality from moral governance, is being argued for here, one which Simpson develops in remarks he makes in his concluding chapter (Chapter 6). There he says that Rousseau's argument is "that there is only one social pact with one set of stipulations and that obedience to these stipulations requires of humanity that its natural inclinations be extinguished and replaced with civic sentiments" (116). He cites a well-known passage from Emile which says that the sentiments of nature can't be preserved in the civil order: "Always in contradiction with himself, always floating between his inclinations and his duties, he will never be either man or citizen" if he attempts to do this (ibid.).

Something has, I think, gone awry here, despite there being undoubtedly some textual evidence in The Social Contract for this dramatic either-or. First, why should we suppose that in the state of nature the only thing that guides people's actions are their passions or desires? Recall that earlier I noted that Simpson said that Rousseau uses a "general" conception of the state of nature as the context for his arguments for the social pact, and this conception includes moral relations. Can it really be argued that the way in which these guide our behaviour is to be figured in terms of the play of inclinations or passions? Second, Simpson allows that Rousseau has a notion of freewill (not his only notion of it) by which humans have the power to acquiesce in or to resist the promptings of inclination. But, he says, "the ground of the choice is still some passion or inclination" (99). But is it, to put it in crude terms, just a matter of the strength or weakness of such passions or is it rather a question of acting on a judgment as to whether it would be good to acquiesce in or to resist them which, as we saw above, was said to be an exercise of moral freedom? Why not the latter? It really isn't clear, as least not to me, that we require the resources of the social pact to be in a position to make judgments of this latter kind and to act on them. I think too extreme a binary opposition is being forced on Rousseau here, and I shall indicate two further reasons why I feel a more complex account of his thinking is required. To begin with, and as noted just above, Simpson cites that passage from Emile where Rousseau seems to say: be either (natural) man or citizen -- you cannot be both. ("This is one of the least ambiguous elements of his presentation" Simpson writes (116).) But yet, on the very next page of the text of Emile Rousseau asks:

But what will a man raised uniquely for himself become for others? If perchance the double object we set for ourselves could be joined in a single one by removing the contradictions of man, a great obstacle to his happiness would be removed. In order to judge of this, he would have to be seen wholly formed: his inclinations would have to have been observed, his progress seen, his development followed. In a word, the natural man would have to be known. I believe that one will have made a few steps in these researches when one has read this writing. (117, Bloom's translation)

These aren't the words of someone who thought this "contradiction" was ineluctable. Additionally, a more complicated point: Simpson holds that Rousseau's view is that when we assent to the social pact we are submitting to a law we have prescribed each to ourselves, and in so doing acquired the possibility of a new form of agency and achieved moral freedom. But we need to ask whether moral freedom is acquired just because "people … act on the basis of their political duties rather than on the basis of drives that nature has, so to speak, forced on them" (96-7); or because of that but also because of the particular character that these political duties have, namely being principles of justice, equality and commitment to the common good? Simpson is very emphatic that the latter is also required, but really doesn't do enough to explain why; just because "the social pact and its consequent laws are … rationally necessary stipulations for entering into and preserving political society" (100) this doesn't show that the acceptance of them yields freedom of any significant kind. Isn't it rather that the reason why by adhering to rules of equality and commitment to the common good I acquire moral freedom is that these rules articulate and express my character as a recognised person of standing among other such persons who together make up our political community, a character that is proper to my moral being, that is my being as a bearer of moral rights committed to acknowledging others as rights bearers also? It is something along these lines, I believe, that lies at the core of Rousseau's conception of moral freedom, a freedom which comprises the ability and opportunity to act as a responsible person of standing in reciprocity with others of like position. I do not pretend that this line of thought, which of course needs a lot more filling out, is in plain view in The Social Contract, but it is strongly present in Emile and Simpson's account of moral freedom might I feel have been richer for attention to this.

Overall I think this is a fine study, full of ideas, which treats of many further matters I haven't touched on. Although clearly and straightforwardly written, I think its primary audience will be those who have already thought a good deal about Rousseau's work; the level of engagement might make it a bit difficult of access to beginners. There were one or two small typos in the text; the only one I noticed that affected the sense occurs where unfortunately "reason" and "sentiment" come in the wrong order, it being said that "human beings become free beings… only because they replace reason with sentiment, thereby lifting themselves from nature's meaningless play of forces into the realm of autonomy"(106)!