Rousseau's Ethics of Truth: A Sublime Science of Simple Souls

Placeholder book cover

Jason Neidleman, Rousseau's Ethics of Truth: A Sublime Science of Simple Souls, Routledge, 2017, 250pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138654785.

Reviewed by Christopher Bertram, University of Bristol


Philosophical engagement with the work of Rousseau has undergone a revival in the anglophone world over the past forty years. Philosophers including N. J. H. Dent, Frederick Neuhouser and Joshua Cohen have discovered more attractive and interesting readings of his moral psychology and political philosophy than were fashionable in an earlier generation that often understood Rousseau as a primitivist or as a proto-totalitarian. But even these new readings of Rousseau have struggled to establish coherence across the full range of his writings, often preferring to concentrate on the moral psychology alone and on a limited number of core texts, particularly the Discourse on Inequality, Emile and the Social Contract.

By focusing on these texts, it is possible to see Rousseau as exploring a number of different pathways by which modern human beings, for whom the satisfaction of amour propre is an inescapable need, can live alongside their fellows while avoiding the pathologies of inequality, dependence and domination. It would not be quite accurate to say that this new Rousseau is an optimistic one, since our prospects for achieving recognition and respect in the eyes of others (either as citizen or lover) are still rather slim, but it would be fair to say that this is not the whole Rousseau. It is not the whole Rousseau because elsewhere, and particularly in texts such as the beginning of the Reveries of the Solitary Walker, he strikes a more pessimistic and solitary note, thinking that our prospects for reconciliation with others are vain and hopeless.

Jason Neidleman aims to present us with a reading of Rousseau that achieves coherence across this wider range of texts and areas of concern by conceiving of him as engaged in a project that he calls an "ethics of truth". This ethics of truth consists in the conviction that knowledge of how best to live and how to achieve a state of communion with a variety of different objects (other people, nature, God) is available to human beings provided they listen to the simple voice of nature and conscience and are not distracted by the artificial obstacles that society places in the way of self-knowledge and the good life. The emphasis on the concept of "communion" and on the extension of our sense of self and existence in relation to others and the world is perhaps the most striking and unifying theme of the book.

Neidleman presents his book as a work of exegesis rather than one of advocacy, though he surely believes that this is exegesis to some purpose and that Rousseau has much of value to say to us. The book is divided into two parts. In the first (chapters 1-3), Neidleman proceeds from the "great principle" that Rousseau claimed underlay and unified all his work following his well-known epiphany on the road to Vincennes that led to the composition of the Discourse on the Sciences and Arts, namely, the claim that man is good by nature but is made wicked by society. The book then explores the nature of the "communion" that constitutes personal or social escape from our modern condition and then connects this to the ethics of truth. In the second part (chapters 4-7), Neidleman examines a series of "pathways to truth", including individual "reverie" leading to communion with nature, the republican project of a just social order, the nature of religious experience and communion with the divine, and the possibility of moral knowledge through listening to the voice of conscience.

Though the structure of each of these chapters varies somewhat, they share a systematic focus on a set of properties that the basic truths essential to human flourishing share. The first of these is their utility: they must make a positive contribution to human happiness. The second is that they must increase individual autonomy, specifically by freeing people from harmful dependence on the will of others (and particularly from the kind of psychological dependence characteristic of amour propre). The third is "immediacy", by which Neidleman means "privileging personally felt experience and sentiment over more mediated modes of engaging the world" (61). The idea here is that, particularly in social and moral matters, we should heed the sentiment interieur -- the inner voice of conscience -- rather than being swayed by the authority of supposed experts, by public opinion or by theoretical reason. The fourth -- not always readily distinguishable from immediacy -- is that the basic truths bearing on human flourishing should be simple rather than sophisticated and therefore equally accessible to all those human beings who are willing to listen to their conscience, rather than being reserved to those who have special training or credentials.

There are many insightful discussions of particular texts and problems in the book, but worthy of special mention is perhaps Neidleman's account of republicanism and democratic politics in Rousseau and his attempt to resolve the tension between the ideal of free self-government and the requirement for a patriotic citizenry. A sense of shared identity and fellow feeling is not just the cultural precondition for citizens being able to legislate together but is, for Neidleman, something that the citizenry actively produces by legislating together. Free government and social solidarity are requirements of and producers of one another. Conceiving of these two poles as part of a virtuous cycle does mean that there is no essential contradiction between them, though it does of course leave unresolved the question of how we get into such a cycle in the first place.

Neidleman's reconstruction of what Rousseau has to say about how we should live and of the various pathways to the good life has much to commend it. The suggestion, for example, that there is less of a gulf between Rousseau's perspectives of "man" and of "the citizen" than many commentators have claimed is well taken. What some readers will perhaps struggle with is the distinctively epistemic spin Neideman puts on this with his claim that Rousseau has a distinctive ethics of truth. Rousseau believed that there were some good ways of living and that much about modernity -- and specifically the grip of inflamed amour propre on our psychology -- makes it difficult to live in ways that are in conformity with our human nature. He also believed that he, somehow, had a privileged access to some deep truths about how we should live, an access denied to most of his fellows because of their pride, vanity, and interdependence in a society marked by inequality. But it is unclear what secures the status of Rousseau's opinions about the good life as truths rather than merely as beliefs that it is practically useful for someone to have. Neidleman is clear that Rousseau's ethics of truth is nothing like a formal theory of what truth is (of the type that might interest modern analytical philosophers), but why should we think of it as an ethics of truth at all, as opposed to, say, an ethics of the self?

Rousseau's faith in the ability of conscience and sentiment to be secure guides to the best ways of living and his belief that reason and argument are treacherous continue to be troubling to his readers. Neidleman's own doubts about this rather come to the fore in a passage towards the end of the book where he discusses Rousseau's insistence on holding firm to what we instinctively "know" on the basis of simple conviction in the face of the scepticism of prideful experts. Rousseau's eighteenth-century contrast is between the naive faith of the ordinary person and the arrogance of the atheistical and cosmopolitan philosophers, and Rousseau sides with the former against the latter. When Neidleman searches for a parallel in the our contemporary world, he has Rousseau supposedly on the side of "validated scientific theories and verified facts" and against "climate deniers", "anti-vaxxers" and "Islamophobes" (232). It is hard not to feel a little disconcerted by this apparently arbitrary switching of the voice of the ordinary untutored person from opposing Enlightenment scientism in one century to supporting it in another. No doubt Neidleman (and I) would wish Rousseau to be on the side of science in the twenty-first-century culture wars, but there is surely more than a small risk that he would disappoint us.

Neidleman has produced a powerful and original synthetic reading of Rousseau's principal works and concerns, one that combines a sensitivity to historical and textual detail with making clear the enduring importance of Rousseau to contemporary moral and political thought. Its value to Rousseau scholars lies in establishing the unity of Rousseau's thinking and basic approach across his writings on nature, politics, morality and religion, where previous scholars had often seen incoherence and division. Both in its overview of Rousseau's Ĺ“uvre and in its penetrating discussions of particular topics such as the practice of "reverie", the relationship between patriotism and popular sovereignty, and Rousseau's wariness about "reason", this book makes a vital contribution to Rousseau studies and one that every serious scholar of Rousseau's work will want to engage with.