Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Nietzsche on Morality

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Leiter, Brian, Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Nietzsche on Morality, Routledge, 2002, 323pp, $15.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415152852.

Reviewed by Bernard Reginster, Brown University


The Routledge Philosophy Guidebooks series is designed to introduce students to classic works of philosophy. Brian Leiter’s Nietzsche on Morality does that, and much more. The book offers a complete commentary of On the Genealogy of Morality, but it also articulates a comprehensive and original interpretation of Nietzsche’s critique of morality. The product is an exceptionally clear and cohesive account of philosophical views known neither for their clarity nor for their cohesiveness.

The book may be divided in two main parts. Chapters 1 through 4 develop an account of Nietzsche’s critique of morality, whereas chapters 5 through 8 focus on the contribution made to this critique by On the Genealogy of Morality. By way of conclusion, chapter 9 raises some critical questions. Although the running commentary on the Genealogy contains a number of interesting interpretations, the substantial contribution of Leiter’s book is to be found in his account of Nietzsche’s critique of morality, which will therefore be the focus of my remarks.

The distinction, and the chief merit, of Leiter’s account is its emphasis on the naturalism of Nietzsche’s approach to morality. Leiter may not quite be the first to portray Nietzsche as a naturalist, but his characterization of Nietzschean naturalism in connection with morality is the most systematic and compelling to date. Chapter 1 carefully circumscribes Nietzsche’s naturalism, by way of some distinctions. According to Leiter, Nietzsche’s naturalism is primarily methodological – he believes that the methods of philosophy ought to be continuous with the methods and results of the empirical sciences – and qualifiedly substantive – he rejects any explanation in terms of non-natural causes (e.g., God), but, in contrast to many contemporary naturalists, he also opposes “materialism,” i.e. the reduction of all phenomena to physical phenomena.

In broad outline, Nietzsche’s naturalism implies that all human beliefs, values, and actions, including moral ones, can be explained by appealing to causal determinants in features of human nature. At the heart of this naturalistic account of morality, there is what Leiter calls the “doctrine of types,” according to which “each person has a fixed psycho-physical constitution, which defines him as a particular type of person” (p. 8). These type-facts, in combination with environmental factors, such as a prevalent moral culture, determine the actual trajectory of a person’s life.

According to Leiter, this naturalism supplies the terms for both an explanation and an evaluation of a morality. All moralities are adopted for prudential reasons, i.e. because they serve the interests of certain types of people. Specifically, a morality is adopted because the environment in which it prevails is favorable to the flourishing of people of that type. Accordingly, a given morality is prudentially good for people of that type, but may be harmful to other types. Moral values are like nutrients, which are valuable insofar as they contribute to the health of a body, and whether they do or not depends on certain facts about that body.

Chapter 2 offers an instructive overview of Nietzsche’s intellectual and historical background, which aims to establish the influence in his development of broad naturalistic themes. Particularly noteworthy is the discussion of the pervasive influence of materialism in German culture, throughout the second half of the 19th century.

Once this background is in place, Leiter turns to the critique of morality. Nietzsche cannot attack all moralities, since his revaluation presupposes some values in terms of which others are revaluated, but he does not direct his attack on some historically or theoretically determinate morality either (such as Christian morality, or utilitarianism). Nevertheless, according to Leiter, it is possible to find a unity to the conception of morality Nietzsche attacks and therefore to develop a coherent account of his critique of it. The morality Nietzsche attacks, “morality in the pejorative sense” as Leiter proposes to call it (or “MPS”), is characterized by distinctive descriptive and normative components. Chapter 3 is devoted to the critique of the descriptive components of MPS, and chapter 4 describes the critique of its normative components.

Although the normative critique remains the most important, Leiter must be commended for bringing greater attention to Nietzsche’s critique of the descriptive component of morality. The descriptive component of MPS is the set of descriptive claims about the nature of human agency, without which moral judgments would not be applicable to human agents. Leiter identifies three such claims in Nietzsche. First, agents must have free will, because MPS holds them responsible for their actions. Hence, if they lack free will, they simply would not be appropriate targets of moral judgment. Second, the motives from which agents act must be recognizable, because MPS judges actions by their motives. Hence, if agents’ motives are inscrutable, so is the moral value of their actions. Finally, all agents must be essentially similar, for MPS presents one code as applicable to all. Hence, if agents prove relevantly different, then a single code cannot apply to all.

Nietzsche’s critique of these three claims is closely connected to his naturalism, particularly his doctrine of types. This doctrine underwrites a kind of metaphysical fatalism (which Leiter characterizes as “causal essentialism” [p. 83]), which is incompatible with free will. As Leiter claims, Nietzsche is driven to metaphysical fatalism by his critique of the doctrine of free will. Of particular interest is Leiter’s observation that Nietzsche develops arguments not just against incompatibilist accounts of free will, but against compatibilist ones as well. Thus, Nietzsche defends epiphenomenalism about consciousness, which suggests that the real motives of an action are not available to the agent’s consciousness and therefore cannot be, for example, the object of a second-order endorsement (as they would have to be on Frankfurt-style compatibilism). Such epiphenomenalism also entails that the real motives of action are inscrutable, so that no action can ever be morally evaluated. Finally, Leiter invokes the doctrine of types (especially the implicit idea that there is more than one type) to debunk the view that all people are essentially similar. Accordingly, no single moral code can apply to all.

Chapter 4 comes to the most important aspect of Nietzsche’s critique, namely his attack on the normative component of MPS. Leiter argues quite persuasively that MPS is objectionable for Nietzsche because it is detrimental to the flourishing of the “higher men.” The distinctive feature of the “higher men” is their creativity. Leiter’s characterizes MPS by means of a list of “pro” and “con” attitudes, whose common feature is that they undermine this creativity (pp. 127 ff.). Central to Leiter’s account, therefore, is the claim that Nietzsche advocates a substantive ethical ideal (the flourishing “higher man”), which is alleged to underwrite his normative critique of MPS. In view of its importance, the reader might wish to know more about this substantive ideal, and here Leiter’s book is short on important details. In general, Leiter shares the puzzlement of many concerning some of the central concepts in terms of which this ideal is articulated, such as the will to power, self-overcoming, and the eternal recurrence, whose importance he proceeds, in my view too hastily, to dismiss or minimize. But even on the terms of his own interpretation, greater detail in the description of the higher men does seem necessary.

Consider the following example. Leiter suggests that the condemnation of suffering is particularly central to MPS. This condemnation of suffering by MPS is objectionable because, Leiter says, “great achievements (certainly great artistic achievements) seem to grow out of intense suffering” (p. 132). But this is saying hardly enough: we need to know more about the relationship of creativity to suffering. Is Beethoven to be admired because he managed to create in spite of his suffering, or because of it? Thus, was his suffering an unfortunate impediment to his creativity, which he had the merit of overcoming, or a source of it? And if suffering was indeed a source of his creativity, was it necessary for it, or could Beethoven have been equally creative, though perhaps in other ways, had he been spared such suffering? Without answers to these questions, it is far from clear how the value assigned to creativity would justify a rejection of MPS, for suffering might not be necessary at all for creativity.

Leiter does suggest that suffering is a necessary condition of creativity. But we are offered no explanation of why this should be so. Moreover, even if this is so, it is not clear that this fact would suffice to justify a rejection of MPS. We might, for example, imagine Beethoven compelled to suffer for the sake of his creativity because he lived in a conservative society, in which creative individuals were isolated, or even opposed and persecuted. This Beethoven could coherently deplore his suffering, even as he acknowledged its necessity for the sake of creativity, and aspire to a world in which one does not have to suffer in order to be creative. He could, in other words, continue to subscribe to MPS’s condemnation of suffering, yet without abandoning his commitment to the value of creativity. In the last analysis, Leiter’s interpretation appears to assume that suffering is essentially necessary for creativity. But that remains to be shown.

Let us now consider the role of the notion of flourishing in Nietzsche’s critique of MPS. On Leiter’s account, Nietzsche operates with two conceptions of value. In asserting that creativity is good, for example, Nietzsche makes, on the one hand, a prudential (or “relational”) claim: creativity is good for an individual of a certain type (the so-called “higher man”). Nietzsche is a realist with regard to prudential value: there are objective facts pertaining to the nature of individuals of this type which determine what counts as flourishing for that individual. On the other hand, the judgment that creativity is good also expresses a non-prudential claim: it is good (or better) to be a flourishing “higher man.” Nietzsche is anti-realist with regard to non-prudential value: in maintaining that it is good (or better) to be a flourishing higher man, Nietzsche is not describing objective facts, but rather expressing a certain evaluative taste or sensibility.

In Leiter’s account, the prudential notion of value combines with the “doctrine of types” to underwrite a kind of pluralism about prudential value. Creativity contributes to the flourishing of some people (the “higher men”), but not of others (the “lower men”). And the evaluative contrast between “higher” and “lower” men is, on this view, nothing more than a matter of taste, and therefore not something the “lower men” should really worry about.

This interpretation, I am afraid, “democratizes” Nietzsche’s ideas too much. Consider, first, the so-called “doctrine of types.” The characterization of the “higher” and “lower” types of men we are proposed (p. 115 ff.) does not suffice to make clear that Nietzsche intended this contrast to underwrite the prudential pluralism Leiter attributes to him. In fact, Nietzsche himself never relativizes the notion of flourishing, which is at the core of the prudential conception of the good, to one or another type of man. On the contrary, he always speaks of “human flourishing” – “the highest power and splendor actually possible to the type man” (GM P 5-6; my emphases). And the contrast between “higher” and “lower” men is interpreted quite plausibly as a contrast between capacities to flourish, not between different types of flourishing. Nietzsche, therefore, would not be a pluralist, but an elitist with regard to prudential value: there is one human flourishing and some human beings are more capable of achieving it than others. This prudential elitism, moreover, allows to make relatively easy sense of a distinctive Nietzschean claim Leiter finds puzzling, namely that MPS is “hostile to life” itself: in being detrimental to the “higher men,” MPS would simply be inimical to a flourishing human life.

None of this, of course, may suffice to resolve the question of non-prudential value: we might still want to know why there should be flourishing human beings in the first place. But it dramatically alters the predicament of the lower men, who can no longer dismiss the superiority of the higher men as an optional matter of taste: it means that what is beyond their capacity is nothing less than human flourishing.

It is true, as Leiter notes on a number of occasions, that Nietzsche insists that MPS “should rule in the herd [i.e. among the “lower men”] – but not reach out beyond it” (p. 147). And this suggests that it is actually not (prudentially) good for the lower men to live by the code favorable to the flourishing of the higher men. However, the only unequivocal statement of this position is found in the unpublished manuscripts (WP 287), which, by Leiter’s own methodology, limits its credibility. More importantly, even this position is compatible with prudential elitism. It seems incompatible with elitism because of the assumption that, in claiming that it is not (prudentially) good for the lower men to live by the code that favors the flourishing of higher men, Nietzsche must rely on a different conception of flourishing, suitable to the lower men. Truthfulness, for example, would not be good for the lower men because the flourishing of men of that type does not include or require truthfulness. But this assumption is incorrect. It may well be that the unqualified pursuit of truthfulness could, for certain types of people in certain circumstances, undermine the possibility of their achieving any measure of truthfulness at all. For example, learning the truth could, for people of a certain type in certain circumstances, wreak such psychological havoc as to damage severely their very capacity to be truthful. It is, in other words, the very ideal of truthfulness, together with a consideration of facts about type and circumstances, which grounds restraints on its own pursuit: “what do you know,” Nietzsche once asks, “of how much falsity I shall require if I am to continue to permit myself the luxury of my truthfulness?” (HH P 4) Hence, a certain ideal of flourishing can, given certain facts about type and circumstances, require limitations on its own pursuit. There is no need to invoke a different ideal of flourishing to make sense of this.

Chapter 5 attempts to determine the contribution a genealogy of MPS makes to this critique. This critique, recall, is that MPS, and more precisely a culture in which MPS prevails, is harmful to the flourishing of higher men. Central to the genealogical method, according to Leiter, is the distinction between practice (e.g., a set of customs) and meaning (the purpose or value assigned to these customs). Nietzsche rejects the presumption that the current meaning of a practice tells anything about its origin. Although Leiter is less than ideally clear on this point, the meaning of a practice seems to refer to the manner in which the individuals engaged in it think about it. For example, Kantians will think of benevolence in terms of preservation of autonomy, while Christians might think of it in terms of love for God’s creation. That a practice of benevolence favors the flourishing of a certain type of men does not seem to be, however, the meaning or purpose of this practice.

Leiter’s account of the critical significance of genealogy draws on Nietzsche’s naturalism, according to which a certain moral code is typically adopted because it serves the interests of a certain type of people. Exposing the origin of MPS is revealing the interests that presided over its creation. This, in turn, enables us to determine whose flourishing MPS causally favors or impedes (p. 178). Importantly, for Leiter, genealogical inquiry also isolates the permanent element of MPS, by distinguishing it from the various meanings it has received throughout its history. This is important, apparently, because only that permanent element has a causal influence on the flourishing of different types of men: “The causal powers belong, as it were, to the ‘permanent’ element of MPS” (ibid.). In contrast, apparently, the meaning assigned to a given moral practice would play no determinant causal role. This is puzzling. In the third essay of the Genealogy, for example, Nietzsche distinguishes between the permanent practice of asceticism and its variable meaning. But he argues that asceticism is objectionable only when it is granted a certain meaning or value. Moreover, it seems quite plausible that the manner in which people think about a given practice would make a difference to its causal influence on their flourishing, and hence to the prudential value we ought to ascribe to it.

The next three chapters are devoted to the three essays of the Genealogy. Leiter’s main goal is to establish the substantive unity of the book. He does so by developing the interesting suggestion that the first two essays notoriously leave open crucial questions, the answer to which depends on the discussion of the ascetic ideal offered in the third essay. To make his case, Leiter maintains that each essay examines a distinct psychological mechanism: “ressentiment (GM I), internalized cruelty (GM II), will to power (GM III)” (p. 182). However, this way of carving out the issues is not well supported by the text, and may not do justice to the complexity of Nietzsche’s psychological views. For one thing, far from being confined to the first essay, the notion of ressentiment is assigned a crucial role in the other two as well (GM, II 11 & GM III 11). And for another, Nietzsche characterizes in terms of will to power both ressentiment (“the will to power of the weakest” [GM III 14; cf. 11 & 15; I 6 & 13]), and cruelty (GM II 5 & 10). Accordingly, the will to power and ressentiment would play a more central role in Nietzschean psychology than Leiter’s relatively brief analyses of these notions suggest.

I should conclude by noting that Leiter’s book contains a number of other stimulating ideas I have not been able to discuss here. In general, the book offers one of the most comprehensive and compelling interpretations of Nietzsche’s critique of morality to date. With its distinctive emphasis on naturalistic themes, it forms a very significant contribution to the study of Nietzsche, and is poised to become a work of reference in the field. Indeed, even the criticisms I have raised about this interpretation owe much to the exceptional clarity and cogency with which it is articulated.