Art as Human Practice: An Aesthetics

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Georg W. Bertram, Art as Human Practice: An Aesthetics, Nathan Ross (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2019, 240pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781350063150.

Reviewed by Sandra Shapshay, Hunter College-CUNY


How much does art really matter to human life? To paraphrase Auden on poetry, perhaps art doesn't make anything happen (at least in politics, in human material conditions, and with respect to weather), and its value consists primarily in being a pleasurable diversion, offering, say, an enjoyable stroll through the museum or an entertaining night out at the theater? Or perhaps art matters a great deal more to the business of living a human life, more akin to religion, science and (for those who go in for it) philosophy? Georg Bertram's book is ambitious and aims to support this latter view of the way art matters.

In this aim, one could see the book as belonging to the tradition of cognitivist/ethical defenders of the value of art, a tradition that stretches from Aristotle to Martha Nussbaum and Berys Gaut today. Yet, Bertram's project is more foundational than these. He seeks not so much to offer an account of the high cognitive/moral value of (at least some) artworks, but rather to dislodge an object-centered approach to defining art more generally, so that philosophers of art come to see the nature and value of art as consisting in a social, reflective practice. In other words, in contrast to the famous line from Auden, Bertram seeks to show how art contributes importantly (though non-exclusively) to making reflective human life happen.

The perspective that Bertram seeks to challenge -- which he labels the "autonomy paradigm" -- operates under the assumption that art is "strictly delimited from other practices in human life" and that art has features that "distinguish it from nonart" (p. 1). He urges us instead to see that "art stands in an essential continuity with other human practices, since it only gets its distinctive potential by taking up a relation to these other practices" (ibid.).

To clarify his novel approach to defining art, and his more moderate conception of aesthetic autonomy -- though I think it would be better put as artistic autonomy, since the book's almost sole focus is on art rather than on nature or the everyday -- Bertram grounds his discussion of art in a Heideggerian-existentialist thought: humans are determined neither by nature nor culture, for "as humans, we always have to define what we are anew", that is, we define ourselves by "taking a stance" on ourselves, and this process involves "a component of reflection that is essential to all of our practices" (p. 3). In this continual project of human self-definition, art plays a key role as one kind of reflective practice among others, such as religion, psychological therapy, theoretical branches of knowledge and philosophy. Like these other practices, art is a practice of reflecting on what it means to lead a human form of life. An implication that Bertram draws from this view is that because art is one of the practices involved in human beings' "taking a stand" on themselves, art as a practice also participates in the project of human freedom. Thus, art is not just a distraction, a playful diversion from the serious business of life; it's an important way in which human beings reflect on and determine how to live their lives, and thus live, in this sense, freely.

I am intrigued by the ontological shift urged by Bertram -- to think of art as a practice rather than as a class of objects -- but I struggled to put some flesh on the rather abstract bones. Throughout this book Bertram stays at a very high altitude of abstraction, and I was never entirely clear about (1) the sorts of practices which art, par excellence, gets us to reflect upon, and concretely how it does this in a variety of media; (2) whether art gets us to reflect on human life in a manner that is different from religion, science, psychotherapy, etc.; and (3) whether all of the works we would typically call "artworks" do this to some extent, or merely a subset of these, say, only the most valuable works of art?

In the introduction, Bertram does make reference to two early 20th c. artistic examples: Proust's In Search of Lost Time which, he holds, prompted readers to reflect upon the nature of human subjectivity, and C├ęzanne's many paintings of Mont Sainte-Victoire, which, he believes, challenged viewers to reflect upon the modern subject's new ways of seeing. But neither of these quick examples illuminated for me the ways in which art is supposed to function at once like other reflective practices (such as religion and philosophy) and in a manner that is different from these. It would have added to the persuasiveness of Bertram's case if he had included more detailed artistic case studies to illustrate the claim that (all?) art or (all really good art?) is a practice of reflection on other human practices. But let me turn now to the particular chapters in which Bertram argues his case.

Chapter One contains a critique of the familiar way that philosophers of art have tried to grasp the nature of art, that is, by distinguishing art from other objects and other practices, and thus determining what makes art special. There is a danger in this approach, namely, "it threatens to make the distinctiveness of art into the decisive feature of how we conceive of it" (p. 15). Bertram's critique of this "autonomy paradigm" is focused on two major philosophers of art, one from the Continental tradition (Christoph Menke) and one from the Anglo-American tradition (Arthur Danto). On Bertram's account of Menke's philosophy of art, the "autonomy of art manifests itself in special kinds of experiences," that is to say, experiences that contrast with our ordinary "frictionless" dealings with things by requiring aesthetic subjects to interpret the meaning of these objects. Accordingly, "artworks suspend the automatic transition from sign to meaning" offering a space for what Menke calls "de-automatization" (p. 21). The main problem that Bertram sees with Menke's theory of art is that "it cannot do full justice to the value that art has in the context of human actions" (p. 30). The value seems reduced to a suspension of our normal understandings of objects, and reduces aesthetic experiences (of art) to those which "do not allow themselves to be embedded into the stream of non-aesthetic experiences . . . [thus] the concrete variety and the meaningfulness of art remain outside the door" (p. 30).

Bertram identifies a similar problem with Danto's definition of art as embodied meaning. In order to distinguish an artwork from an ordinary thing (e.g., Warhol's Brillo Boxes from perceptually identical boxes of Brillo pads on a supermarket shelf), Danto needs another thesis, namely, the view that "the specificity of artworks consists in the fact that they confront us with a definite artistic way of seeing" (p. 36). Otherwise put, "artworks [unlike ordinary nonart objects] present a definite artistic self-comprehension," they "self-comprehend . . . as art" (p. 36). The problem Bertram sees in Danto's version of the "autonomy paradigm" is that while it does "succeed at making artworks comprehensible as . . . documents of historical and cultural practice", "Artworks are defined as art regardless of how they are connected with human practice (as we see especially . . . [with] works of modern art)" (p. 38). If I understand Bertram's criticism correctly, the main problem seems to be that a work of art that is, for instance, simply about the perceptual qualities of paint and the actions of the painter (as are, arguably, Jackson Pollock's drip and action paintings) will still count as art on Danto's definition, even though these works have no apparent reflective link to human practices, the sine qua non of art proper according to Bertram.

At this point in the argument I became somewhat confused about Bertram's overall proposal. For the sake of argument, let's grant that a Pollock action painting is simply about the material/perceptual qualities of paint and the actions of the painter. Let's also grant that this means that such a painting does not really engage a viewer in a practice of reflection on human practices because these paintings only guide reflection on paint and painterly practice, and not much more. Does Bertram's proposal mean to get us to revise our view of whether a Pollock action painting qualifies as art at all? It seems so. But if this is the case, the project turns out to be a highly revisionist one, shrinking the scope of works properly called "art" rather drastically.

Unfortunately, nothing in the introduction to this book really prepares us for this revisionism. Rather, it seemed initially that Bertram meant to offer a theory of art that would more or less encompass all of the works we typically lump together under that concept, while illuminating what they share and why they matter (admittedly, a tall order). But it now seems that he is proposing a very high functional/evaluative bar for a work legitimately to be termed "art", one that will likely exclude a great deal of modernist paintings, and other works that do not guide novel reflection on the human condition or do not do so well. That the definition of art on offer is highly revisionist is not itself a criticism, but I do think the burden of proof is squarely on the revisionist theorist to show us why the common usage of our concept of art is mistaken.

In urging this revision, Bertram seeks to revitalize some Hegelian (and to a lesser extent, Kantian) themes in Chapter Two. Especially appreciated is Hegel's notion that

Artworks are not just objects that have a meaning, but rather they contribute something special to our historical and cultural practices within the framework of a form of life by reflecting those orientations that are central to our practices, and hence they manage to infuse life into those practices. (p. 74)

Unlike Hegel, however, Bertram does not embrace the "end of art" thesis, nor does he embrace Hegel's hierarchy of the arts. Rather, Bertram holds that art "has a special way of provoking changes within human practices" (p. 95) not to be superseded by the more conceptual practices of religion and philosophy, and thus art is here to stay.

In Chapters Three and Four he takes up the special way that art is supposed to provoke changes within human practices. Keen to include works of conceptual art and literature (p. 125), Bertram does not see art's special power as residing in its sensible-materiality. Rather, the specific nature and efficacy of art inheres in the fact that "in art, various human practices come to be negotiated in a practical way . . . Artworks bring about challenges to other practices, so that these other practices come to be confirmed or altered, and hence expanded" (p. 101). Thus, Bertram sums up the nature and high value of art as follows: "Art has to be understood as a process of negotiation"; it is a negotiation with two aspects: (1) "artworks evoke practices of reception", and (2) "these practices of reception stand in connection with other practices in the world that are not aesthetic: They leave a trace within these other practices in a variety of ways." (p. 114)

The nonaesthetic activities in which art leaves a trace seem to be the ways in which we interpret and deal with other objects and human beings, in terms of our bodily, emotional, and symbolical responses (pp. 146-147). In sum, then, Bertram wants us to understand the specific nature of artworks as follows:

the specific nature of artworks thus does not have to do with the particular properties of artworks, but rather with the way in which they provoke us to negotiate new practices. We thus have to think of art as a reflection that arises from dealing with dynamic objects. In art, objects provoke various activities by means of which humans seek to define (or redefine) the rest of their activities. Art is to this extent a practice by which people define themselves, and this self-definition is connected in a special way with objects that are valuable to humans because of their special potential for negotiating practice. (p. 159)

This book helpfully focusses our attention on the way art can constitute an important reflective practice in human life, but I remain resistant to the notion that art should be defined as a practice of re-negotiating other important human practices, and that this characterizes the sole or main value of art. One reason I failed to be converted to this revisionist view is that I yearned for a concrete discussion of a paradigm case. So in evaluating this proposal, I am supplying my own (admittedly very American) example of a powerful socially-reflective work of art: Lin-Manuel Miranda's Hamilton (2015). It's a musical that engages a viewer in a guided, often self-referential reflection on the story of a lesser-known founder of the American republic, but also -- with its unconventional casting, use of hip-hop and other Black Atlantic styles of music and dance -- guides the audience in a reflection on American identity, on who gets to "tell the story" of the U.S. The musical has certainly enlivened reflection on these topics and has become a touchstone in U.S. political discussions (concerning immigration, the Black Lives Matter movement, the idea of the "self-made man", etc.). In this way, the work serves as a challenging reflective practice about other human practices such as socio-political inclusion and exclusion, power, and revolt; but, and I think this is Bertram's point, Hamilton is not a practice that is isolated from other reflective practices, say, like writing op-eds about the state of American politics, or more everyday practices of interpreting others and negotiating cultural differences. I think Bertram's ultimate point is to focus in our theories of art on these sorts of continuities with other social practices, rather than thinking of Hamilton qua art as something isolated from normal life. Thus, he writes, "In art we put our work into objects, though not for the sake of the objects, but for our own sake. Objects do not stand on their own, but in relation to human practices. In this later respect, they must always stand up to the test of being challenging in new ways" (p. 234).

Highlighting the continuities between art's way of negotiating human practices and other reflective practices like religion and philosophy adds a novel and thought-provoking way of seeing the nature and value of art to the theoretical landscape. However, I believe this book swings the pendulum too far away from the autonomy paradigm, for it seems that it is precisely the special, "apart-from-normal-life" experience of, say, the musical Hamilton, that lends it a significant reflective power over human beings. That people enter the theater (a kind of sacred space), and attend to the performance for its own sake and to discern its meaning, constitutes a kind of break from ordinary life (cf. Menke and the view of aesthetic experience as in some sense 'disinterested'), and this relative autonomy from the business of normal life seems precisely to lend art a power to effect change within it.

In conclusion, two brief points: First, the translator, Nathan Ross, has done an excellent job of rendering the text into fluid, readable English. Second, this book builds an important bridge between contemporary Continental and Anglo-American philosophy of art, as Bertram rather seamlessly discusses figures who rarely meet under the same cover: Heidegger, Adorno, Gadamer, Menke, Luhmann, and Seel are put into dialogue with Goodman, Danto, Carroll, Nussbaum and Levinson. The result is a challenging book for Anglo-American philosophers of art, one that should provoke thoughtful discussion on whether and/or to what extent art should be viewed in a less object-centered manner, as a reflective practice.