Rules, Reason, and Self-Knowledge

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Julia Tanney, Rules, Reason, and Self-Knowledge, Harvard University Press, 2013, 368pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674067080.

Reviewed by David Robb, Davidson College


This book collects sixteen articles, critical reviews, and responses that Julia Tanney has written over the past two decades. Most are previously published; a few (chs. 8, 11, 16) appear for the first time along with an introduction summarizing the volume. The chapters cover a range of issues in the philosophy of mind, including rule-following, psychological explanation, mental representation, and self-knowledge.

Together these essays constitute a sustained attack on current orthodoxy in philosophy of mind. This view -- really a cluster of related doctrines -- appears in a number of guises and under various labels, including realism, functionalism, individualism, computationalism, and cognitivism. Several philosophers speak on behalf of orthodoxy in the volume -- often Fodor and Davidson, but sometimes Putnam, Crane, Rey, and others. Tanney argues that there are deep conceptual problems here, problems that were in fact exposed decades ago by philosophers such as Wittgenstein, Anscombe, and especially Ryle. She urges that we reconsider the insights of this earlier generation, which were rejected without sufficient justification during the cognitivist revolution.

In what follows, I'll look briefly at the volume's four main parts. (Section headings below, except for the last, are the titles of these parts.)

Rules and Normativity

The case against cognitivism begins in Part I. Here the main target is the doctrine that rational action is explained by our internally representing and following rules (principles, norms) for action. This doctrine, like cognitivism itself, is a "mythical picture that needs resisting" (94). Internalized rules can explain rational behavior only insofar as they are understood, compared to other (potentially competing) norms, judged to be applicable to a given situation, and followed. But these are themselves cognitive activities that can be performed with varying degrees of correctness, and in particular must be performed rationally in order for knowledge of the rules to explain rational behavior. In this way, "the type of explanation proposed presupposes the disposition which is part of that which is to be  explained" (38).

If it even makes sense to talk about rules that govern rule-following, following these rules would involve the very same abilities that the rules were introduced to govern. There is thus no possibility that knowledge of them could serve as an explanation of these abilities" (71).

Moreover, the general strategy of introducing "rules that govern rule-following" leads to a regress. The point remains, Tanney says, whether rules are learned or innate, conscious or unconscious, explicit or tacit, personal or sub-personal.

In response, one sort of cognitivist will want to explain the rational following of internal rules by appeal, not to higher-order rules, but to causal relations among internal representations. For an agent rationally to understand and follow rules is for that agent's internal representations to be part of a certain kind of causal (say, computational) network. But with the descriptive notion of causation, the cognitivist has lost the normative dimension of rule-following: the causal solution "destroys the possibility of error" (80); it "leads to the dissolution of the normative nature of the phenomenon to be explained" (82).

The terrain here is familiar, as Tanney is well aware. I will briefly mention one option that she acknowledges (and rejects) but which receives relatively little attention in the book: find the desired normativity in the proper functioning of the internal causal system. If function can be naturalized, this would seem to deliver the desired normativity, and without the threatened regress. That said, while the appeal to the proper functioning of internal processing would stop the regress, the anti-cognitivist might then wonder why internal rules were needed in the first place. Why not account for rational action by appealing to the proper functioning of overt action? Here I think the cognitivist should say -- largely on empirical grounds -- that this stops the regress too early; I'll return to this point briefly below.

In any case, Tanney grants that we do on occasion represent rules for action, but this is rare. And even in those cases in which rules are explicit, they are abstractions from the behavior they describe: "rules may be implicated in our practices merely in the sense that an observer can read them off from the practice in question" (91). If there is a causal explanation to be had of rule-following behavior, it will typically appeal, not to the internal representation of rules, but to more ordinary notions such as skill and practice.

Reason-Explanation and Mental Causation

Part II takes up the closely related  question of psychological explanation. What are we to make of the widely used, deeply entrenched, and impressively successful explanations appealing to beliefs, desires, and other mental states? If there's a standard view here, it's that reasons-explanations are causal: the beliefs and desires cited are internal, causally efficacious states of the individual. This is the upshot of Davidson's influential argument in "Actions, Reasons, and Causes". The idea, in brief, is that among the many reasons an agent has for an action is a privileged set that explains the action, those for which the agent acts. Causation, says Davidson, is needed to mark out this explanatory set: for me to act for reasons is, in part, for those reasons to cause what I do.

The reply to Davidson begins in ch. 5, "Why Reasons May Not be Causes", one of the volume's best and most cited essays. While Davidson and Tanney are sometimes allied against cognitivism -- e.g., both reject psychological laws -- here Davidson speaks for orthodoxy. Tanney asks us to consider more carefully the sorts of examples usually marshaled by Davidson and his followers. These examples are frequently underdescribed, and when we fill out their details, there often appears "a more complex justificatory machinery" (109) permitting us to distinguish the explanatory set. We can see, for example, that some reasons "have more weight than others" (110), or that one set is explicitly avowed by the agent. Such added details, Tanney believes, need not invoke causes.

If reasons-explanations are not causal, what do they accomplish? Here Tanney asks us to "take Wittgenstein's advice not to think but to look" (128). We're not to engage in abstract, decontextualized analysis of our mentalistic concepts, but instead to consider the everyday circumstances in which we attribute beliefs and desires, how we justify and revise such attributions, and what we take them to accomplish. Tanney spends much of Part II engaged in this sort of looking, concluding that reasons-explanations aim to make sense of the agent's behavior, to put it "in a context that helps to make it intelligible" (178). The enterprise is normative, not causal, and our focus throughout is on the outside -- on the agent's circumstances and social context -- not on mysterious inner causes, which would lead to well-known epistemological puzzles (161).

I can't here join the ongoing battle between Davidson's followers and their anti-causalist opponents. I will, however, suggest a more modest point on behalf of the orthodoxy. Supposing Tanney is right about the function of reasons-explanations, there are still, it seems to me, pressing causal questions. Something must causally produce, sustain, and guide the motions of the human body as it navigates a complex and unpredictable world. Even if these motions are not behavior, they do, at least in part, constitute behavior, and in any case, they exhibit a high degree of fine-tuned responsiveness that calls out for causal explanation. (Whatever the explanatory merits of our norms of rationality, they can't get a body in motion: this requires the redistribution of energy.) Internal representations might emerge on empirical grounds as the best (proximate) causes of the movements that constitute rational behavior. And this could be the case even if Tanney is right that picking out such causes is not the function of ordinary, pre-scientific reasons-explanations.

Philosophical Elucidation and Cognitive Science

The essays in the third part include critiques of cognitivism as it appears in Crane's The Mechanical Mind (ch. 9) and Fodor's The Language of Thought (ch. 12). Those looking for a compact statement of Tanney's case against cognitivism would do well to consult these chapters, either of which would make a useful addition to a syllabus giving substantial attention to cognitivism and its critics. In any case, many of the themes discussed appear elsewhere in the volume, so here I'll look at a topic unique to Part III: the zombie (ch. 10).

A zombie is a being who isn't conscious -- all is phenomenally "dark" inside -- yet who nevertheless resembles conscious beings in some important physical respects. The "respects" in question can vary, generating different sorts of zombie. Here Tanney scrutinizes what is normally thought to be the least controversial variety, the behavioral zombie. This is a being who shares all of my behavioral dispositions (say I'm the conscious being in question) yet who is not conscious.

By Tanney's lights, acknowledging the possibility of such a being -- and by extension, zombies whose physical resemblance to me is even closer -- requires a radical break from our ordinary concept of consciousness. We can see this if we look at our practices of attributing psychological states to others. My behavioral duplicate is clearly able to discern and describe surrounding objects, so we would normally say that he can see. He responds to questions and reacts to requests, so we would normally say he's awake. And so on. Yet as a zombie, he is supposed neither to see nor to be awake. Withholding such descriptions for the zombie starts to look nonsensical:

if we are told that zombies are defined as both being behaviorally indistinguishable from us and as not being able, for example, to see, then we should insist that we no longer understand what it means to see, and so forth, for all the other terms associated with consciousness concepts that have a perfectly normal role in our language. (212)

If the zombie is claimed not to be conscious, it can only be in a sense that significantly distorts our actual concept.

Zombie-philes will protest that Tanney is conflating different kinds of consciousness. It may indeed be a conceptual oddity to deny that my behavioral twin sees or is awake. But the zombie literature is typically concerned primarily with phenomenal consciousness, the "what it's like" variety. It's this sort that the zombie lacks, and it seems we can, without inconsistency, describe my behavioral twin as unconscious, even if we must at the same time describe him as seeing, awake, and so on. Tanney might question whether this notion of phenomenal consciousness can get a foothold outside of our ordinary practices of psychological attribution. But the zombie-philes insist that we're to grasp phenomenal consciousness from the first-person perspective, from the inside: it need not find a home in our ordinary, public practices.

Since Tanney here targets the behavioral zombie, this is a good place to ask a question that might arise in any part of the book: Is Tanney calling for a return to behaviorism? There are clear affinities with behaviorism here, but like Ryle and Wittgenstein before her, Tanney resists the label, and for at least two reasons. First, she never denies that there are mental states such as inner episodes of thought (192) and processes of deliberation (26), nor does she deny that they can sometimes cause what we do (7, 355). Tanney questions, not the existence or causal efficacy of such states, but their explanatory importance in understanding ourselves, our behavior, and our interpersonal practices. Second, the (logical) behaviorists wanted to analyze mental concepts in dispositional-behavioral terms. But Tanney's project is not analysis but "conceptual cartography" (258). The idea, I take it, is to chart connections among our mentalistic concepts or expressions, explore the limits of their application, and, most generally, to locate them in our everyday practices, our ways of life. This enterprise is unlikely to yield -- and in any case, does not aim to yield -- an analysis as traditionally understood.


This fourth and final part is largely concerned with a cluster of puzzles about self-knowledge. Here cognitivist orthodoxy says that first-person knowledge amounts to a special kind of access we have to our own internal states, states whose existence and nature is prior to our knowing them. First-person access could be spelled out in terms of direct acquaintance, inner perception, or some other internal causal process in which the target state is implicated. By contrast, we lack this special sort of access to others, whose minds must be discerned, if at all, via empirical observation.

Another, much different, attempt to explain the special features of self-knowledge is the "constitutive" theory on which the known state does not pre-exist one's knowledge of it. Somehow the very act of self-ascribing a belief or intention (e.g.) makes the ascription true by constituting the ascribed state. Since the ascription of beliefs and intentions to others is not in this way self-fulfilling, first-person ascriptions are privileged in a way that third-person ascriptions are not.

Tanney finds useful insights in both approaches, and favors a middle way. While self-knowledge doesn't involve tracking an internal representation, the cognitivists, she says, were right to present self-knowledge as a kind of insight or achievement (291), one subject to ascription-independent standards. On the other hand, the constitutivists (in ch. 13, Crispin Wright speaks for them) correctly note that one's self-ascriptions can in some important way make it the case that one believes or intends something. Psychological self-ascription contains elements of both discovery and creation. The task is to integrate both insights into a unified theory of self-knowledge.

Tanney's account, as I understand it, turns on one of the book's major themes: the importance, in psychological ascription and explanation, of fitting behavior into an rational, intelligible pattern. When I self-ascribe a belief, say, there is a clear sense in which I am -- just as in the case of third-person ascriptions -- discerning patterns in my own behavior as well as noting salient similarities between these and the behavior and circumstances of others. I'm trying to find the best way to make sense of what I've done, and if I'm successful, my self-knowledge is an achievement, one that can be judged against an external standard (and one that, I take it, could be corrected by others). At the same time, however, when I self-ascribe a belief, I am also resolving to interpret my past behavior and shape future action in light of what I should do, in light of my conception of what's rational (310). In this sense, self-knowledge does not merely report an independently existing state of affairs, but is creative in the sense that it resolves indeterminacies in my psychological life up to now and shapes these facts going forward.


Some philosophers, especially those trained in the orthodoxy, will be averse to revisiting debates that, in their view, were decided decades ago -- on both philosophical and empirical grounds -- in favor of cognitivism. I'm sympathetic with such philosophers, but there is reason to temper such a reaction. For one thing, even those who strongly disagree with Tanney's approach will, I think, find in these essays a lucid and systematic statement of arguments and positions that were not always put so clearly by the earlier generation of philosophers who inspired this volume. For another, cognitivism has already been independently challenged on a number of fronts. Consider, to take just a few examples, the "embodied cognition" movement, the worries about mental causation plaguing non-reductive physicalism, and the persistent, if still minority, voices of the anti-causalists. Add philosophy's renewed interest in Anscombe's work, as well as the sixtieth anniversary reissue of The Concept of Mind (which includes a substantial introduction by Tanney), and Tanney's collection looks timely, a fresh look at past debates whose impact on the philosophy of mind, for better or worse, continues to be felt.