Russell's Theory of Perception (1905-1919)

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Sajahan Miah, Russell's Theory of Perception (1905-1919), Continuum, 2006, 242pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826480802.

Reviewed by Christopher Pincock, Purdue University


As the title indicates, this book is a focused study of Russell's views on perception during the period from 1905, when "On Denoting" appeared, to 1919, when Miah believes that Russell adopted a new theory of perception in line with the shift to neutral monism (5). For Russell, an account of perception should explain how perception contributes to knowledge, and so Miah's book can be fairly described as an investigation of Russell's changing epistemology from 1905 through 1919. Miah reconstructs Russell's views on perception and knowledge using a wide range of Russell's works, including unpublished manuscripts, and usefully relates his interpretations to the main views defended in the secondary literature.[1] His book is a welcome contribution to the specialist literature in the history of analytic philosophy and will hopefully help to convince the non-specialist that Russell's account of perception is more nuanced than it might otherwise appear.

Russell's most extensive discussions of the relation of perception to knowledge in this period come in the widely read Problems of Philosophy (1912), the Theory of Knowledge manuscript (1913) and the 1914 Lowell Lectures, published as Our Knowledge of the External World as a Field for Scientific Method in Philosophy. Miah quite rightly emphasizes the dramatic shift from Russell's views in Problems to Our Knowledge and uses it to structure his book. In Problems Russell argued that our experiences give us good reason to infer the existence of physical objects, and also allow us to discern some of their most important features. By Our Knowledge, Russell is motivated by his supreme maxim that "Wherever possible, logical constructions are to be substituted for inferred entities" (noted at 110) to claim that we can construct physical objects out of the sorts of things that we experience. Both the inferential and the constructional accounts cohere with Russell's view that experience acquaints us with particulars known as sense-data, and not ordinary physical objects like tables and chairs. After a short introductory chapter, Miah begins his discussion with chapters on Russell's theory of acquaintance and his views about sense-data. Chapter 4 explains the inferential account of our knowledge of physical objects from Problems, while chapters 5 and 6 consider the constructional approach for ordinary physical objects as well as space and time. A concluding chapter gives Miah's considered evaluation of Russell's views on perception and knowledge.

The main interpretative claim of the book is that Russell's various proposals are motivated by a desire to reconcile empiricist foundationalism with a realist interpretation of ordinary and scientific language:

Russell seems to be trapped in a dilemma. On the one hand, if he does his epistemology from the standpoint of extreme empiricism, he undermines the beliefs of scientific common sense. On the other hand, if he does his epistemology from the standpoint of scientific common sense, then he undermines his empiricist conviction. The first horn of this dilemma is the direct result of his empiricist-foundationalist view of knowledge. The second horn of the dilemma is the result of his bias towards science and common sense (175).

According to Miah, in Problems Russell believed that he had found a completely secure foundation for our scientific knowledge by restricting the objects of our immediate perception to sense-data. But in 1912, in the manuscript "On Matter", Russell rejected any attempt to infer the existence of physical objects based on the features of sense-data. Here Russell's argument against his previous view is seen to turn on a more thoroughgoing application of the skeptical arguments considered in Problems. Russell's interactions with Wittgenstein are posited as the main cause of Russell's rethinking his earlier views.

In his second phase, Russell tries to interpret in a realistic fashion the language of common sense and physics using logical constructions out of sense-data, including both the sense-data actually experienced by individuals as well as the "sensibilia" that are in fact never experienced. Miah explains how Russell conceives of sense-data as mind-independent entities, and how this allows Russell to posit sensibilia. Drawing on sources such as the 1913 note "The Nature of Sense-Data: A Reply to Dawes Hicks", Miah shows Russell consistently ascribing features to sense-data that are at odds with traditional empiricism (60-63, 64-66). But when it comes to the sense-data that are experienced, Miah notes Russell's repeated claims that perception of sense-data is error-free: "For Russell to say that sense-data are immediately known is to say that their being present to a perceiver is complete evidence for beliefs concerning them" (58).

The problem is that even if we have infallible access to our own sense-data, we lack it in the cases of the sense-data of others and of unperceived sensibilia. This strongly suggests that positing the unperceived sensibilia necessary for Russell's logical constructions is no better than an outright assumption of the existence of ordinary physical objects. Miah responds to this common objection to Russell's logical constructions by noting that even though they fail to overcome traditional Cartesian doubts, they still represent a more secure "horizontal inference" that remains in the same general category of sense-data, as opposed to a more speculative "vertical inference" from sense-data to ordinary physical objects (119-124).

Miah is surprisingly generous when he comes to evaluate Russell's proposals about perception. While he agrees that the early, inferential proposal is doomed, he argues that Russell's later, constructional project is adequate, at least as long as some doubt is allowed: "So long as Russell steps aside from absolute certainty and absolute verifiability claims (which he did), the constructionist theory, its incompleteness notwithstanding, works well as a theory of perception" (195, emphasis added). Here I would like to offer two points of disagreement. On the historical side, given that Miah recognizes that Russell eventually settled for less than a response to Cartesian doubt, what is the evidence that he ever was an "extreme empiricist"? Secondly, in connection with contemporary debates about perception, can we really defend a Russellian constructional approach?

According to Miah, Russell recoiled from extreme empiricism only in 1914 in places like Our Knowledge and only after "he realized that there was no way to make his logical construction complete" (194) without positing some unperceived sensibilia. Here we have clear statements from Russell like "Universal scepticism, though logically irrefutable, is practically barren" (noted at 204). But there is also textual evidence that Russell allowed for doubts about the features of sense-data, even those we are acquainted with, prior to 1914. For example, in the 1913 Theory of Knowledge manuscript, Russell devotes an entire chapter to considering what happens when we analyze a complex entity that we perceive, like a letter "T", into its parts. Russell concedes that analysis is sometimes "a very difficult mental feat" (Russell 1913/1992, 128) and appears to endorse the claim that "We may be acquainted with a complex without being able to discover, by introspective effort, that we are acquainted with the objects which are in fact its constituents" (Russell 1913/1992, 121, emphasis removed). Or, as Miah himself notes, in 1913 and afterwards Russell allows that "one can be acquainted with particulars themselves without recognizing the properties they happen to exemplify" (76). Even in Problems, where skeptical doubts are repeatedly invoked, we find Russell also placing great weight on what he calls our "instinctive beliefs": "All knowledge, we find, must be built up upon our instinctive beliefs, and if these are rejected, nothing is left …  There can never be any reason for rejecting one instinctive belief except that it clashes with others; thus, if they are found to harmonize, the whole system becomes worthy of acceptance" (Russell 1912, 25; cf. 89-93). All this suggests that Russell never endorsed the extreme empiricism that Miah attributes to him. If this is correct, then Miah's reconstruction of why Russell changed from the inferential to the constructional approach needs to be revised, as does the proposed role of Wittgenstein.

I turn now to Miah's other claim that once a more modest form of empiricism is on offer, Russell's logical construction of physical objects from sense-data "works well as a theory of perception." I do not think that Miah has yet done enough to support this positive conclusion. To begin with, his discussion of Russell's logical constructions are fairly informal and do not engage with the difficulties of linking constructed entities up to the laws of the scientific theories that Russell considers. Miah explicitly notes the limitations of his own reconstruction of Russell's proposals (149), but apparently does not think that this impairs an evaluation of Russell's program. More seriously, Miah shows an insufficient appreciation of the pressures that Russell's constructions are under, due to the gap between what Russell thinks we experience and the proposals of the special theory of relativity. In the first edition of Our Knowledge Russell aims to construct the spatial points and temporal instants of each private perspective and then to show how these private spaces and times can be correlated across perspectives to construct the public space and time invoked in physics. Miah does not adequately distinguish these two steps, and speaks as if Russell's "construction of time" applied directly to the time mentioned in physics. This leads Miah to some problematic conclusions, including that "The theory of relativity denies, so does Russell, the existence of an objective (absolute) time" (165). Setting aside the fact that Miah seems to run together the special and the general theory of relativity, he also fails to note remarks by Russell like "The correlation of different private times is regulated by the desire to secure the simplest possible statement of the laws of physics, and thus raises rather complicated technical problems; but from the point of view of philosophical theory, there is no very serious difficulty of principle involved" (Russell 1914, 122). This suggests that in 1914, Russell was quite happy to think of physical time as objective, but more historical reconstruction is needed to see what Russell had in mind, or whether it was plausible.

It seems clear, then, that we cannot endorse Russell's approach to perception without investigating the details of the scientific theories at issue, and for the special and general theory of relativity, not to mention quantum mechanics, it is far from clear that Russell's approach is adequate. Despite these issues, Miah's survey of Russell's views on perception and knowledge is an important step forward in our understanding of Russell's philosophy, and is recommended to all those interested in the philosophy of perception and its history.



Hylton, Peter (1990), Russell, Idealism and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy, Clarendon Press.

Russell, Bertrand (1912), Problems of Philosophy, Oxford University Press.

Russell, Bertrand (1913/1992), Theory of Knowledge: The 1913 Manuscript, Routledge.

Russell, Bertrand (1914), Our Knowledge of the External World as a Field for Scientific Method in Philosophy, Open Court.


[1] The only surprising omission from Miah's secondary sources is Hylton 1990.