Russell's Unknown Logicism: A Study in the History and Philosophy of Mathematics

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Sébastien Gandon, Russell's Unknown Logicism: A Study in the History and Philosophy of Mathematics, Palgrave Macmillan, 2012, 263pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230576995.

Reviewed by Kevin C. Klement, University of Massachusetts, Amherst


Bertrand Russell once despaired that at one time he knew of only six people who had read the later parts of his voluminous Principia Mathematica (PM), his magnum opus on mathematical logic co-written with Alfred North Whitehead. "Three of these were Poles, subsequently (I believe) liquidated by Hitler. The other three were Texans, subsequently successfully assimilated." (My Philosophical Development, p. 86). He was surely exaggerating for dramatic purposes, but all the same, were he alive today, he would no doubt be pleased to learn of Sébastien Gandon's new book. It is dedicated to bringing to light the "unknown" parts of Russell's logicism, i.e., the later parts of both Principia Mathematica and Russell's earlier Principles of Mathematics (PoM), dealing with such topics as projective and metrical geometry, real analysis, quantity and measurement. In focusing on these relatively neglected parts of Russell and Whitehead's work on the foundations of mathematics, Gandon's study helps partly to fill a lacuna in the secondary literature. 

At the same time, Gandon claims that attention to these topics gives us a better and more well-rounded understanding of exactly what their overall logicist program was, and indeed, a clearer grasp of Russell's conception of logical and philosophical analysis generally. Gandon argues that the usual focus on the analysis of philosophically basic concepts rather than more sophisticated mathematical ones gives us only part of the picture. As he eloquently puts it:

My suggestion is rather that scholars, when dealing with Russell's conception of analysis, nourish their thinking with only one kind of example and then become the victims of a one-sided diet. (p. 2)

Gandon's first three chapters aim to challenge what has come to be known as the "if-thenist" interpretation of Russell's logicism, put forth by Alan Musgrave and others. On this interpretation, rather than actually deriving from logical principles the theorems of various branches of mathematics -- geometry chief among them -- outright, Whitehead and Russell managed only to show that conditionals of the form "Ap1", "Ap2" could be derived, where A is the conjunction of the axioms of a certain mathematical theory, and p1, p2, etc., the results of those axioms. Fuel for this interpretation is given by Russell himself, who at certain points (such as PoM §1), suggests that mathematical truths are always conditional in form. This reading threatens to trivialize the logicist reduction, as it would only require that the results logically follow from the axioms, not that the axioms themselves be in any sense logically true. Indeed, conceivably, a conditional of the form "Ap" could be a logical truth even when A and p are contingent claims made in an empirical science. In response to this, it could be pointed out that Russell believed that no one set of geometrical axioms ought to be taken as "mathematically" true; instead, the preference of say, Euclidean geometry or one system of non-Euclidean geometry over another was instead only relevant for the application of mathematics in science. From this perspective, it would be inappropriate for the axioms of any one kind of geometry, for example, to be put forward as logical truths.

Gandon, however, goes further in responding to the if-thenist interpreter. He does this in part by pointing to situations in which multiple different ways of stating a branch of mathematical knowledge as a deductive system were possible but Russell (or Whitehead and Russell) gave privilege to one method as opposed to another. If the if-thenist were right, it would seem that Russell would be equally happy with any treatment of a branch of mathematics that allowed it to be logicized in the form of such conditionals. In the first chapter, Gandon discusses the two different accounts of projective geometry given in Chapters 45 and 46 of PoM, one due to Pasch, the other due to Pieri. Although both were formally adequate and could be "logicized" in Russellian fashion, either in terms of ordinal relations (Pasch's approach) or incidence relations (Pieri's approach), Russell preferred Pieri's approach because it fit better with how geometers themselves tended to think about space and the special nature of the subject matter of their studies. Similarly, in Chapter 2, Gandon notes that Russell considered three different treatments of metrical geometry: one derived from Klein's work in which it can be treated as an outgrowth of projective geometry, another "Leibnizian" view that approaches it from the concepts of order and ordering relations, and finally one that takes it to involve empirically given "magnitudes of divisibility". Russell in the end seems to conclude that this last treatment best captures the specific nature of metrical geometry and therefore excludes it from his vision of pure mathematics. If the if-thenist interpretation were right, it is hard to understand this attitude, especially when two other possibilities which allowed for the "logicizing" of the subject were on the table.

A major theme of the book as a whole -- stressed even more in the second half dedicated to PM's treatment of quantity and real analysis -- involves Russell's understanding of the relationship between mathematics prior to analysis and the results of analysis. Gandon depicts Russell's attitude here as an intermediate between two more extreme positions dubbed the Fregean view and the Wittgensteinian view. (Gandon is here building upon work done by François Rivenc. He also rightly notes that for his purposes it matters relatively little whether or not these views can be ascribed unproblematically to Frege or Wittgenstein; the important thing is the relationship between these views and Russell's.) On the Fregean view, in a logical reconstruction of an existing part of mathematics, one can regard all the definitions used in the reconstruction as stipulative, in which case it does not matter whether or not they match the pre-analyzed conceptions presently in use by mathematicians. On the Wittgensteinian approach, however, any recasting of the material of an existing branch of mathematics threatens to change the nature of its content, and therefore, the success of an analysis may only be judged by the working practitioners of the existing branch as to whether or not it preserves adequately the original mathematical notions.

Gandon claims that Russell and Whitehead wanted a position that was sensitive both to the mindset of working mathematicians, as well as to the application of various mathematical theories outside of pure mathematics, but in which these were not to be taken as the final word; considerations germane only to pure logic had a place too. For example, while Russell and Whitehead often praised the "arithmetization" of various notions of mathematics such as the treatment of quantity, more often than not they simply took various arithmetical models of more sophisticated branches of mathematics as providing existence theorems rather than defining the subject matter of these branches. Their subject matter was instead defined in terms of certain relation-types of which the number-theoretic model only provided one instance. This was done at least in part to facilitate the application of a given branch of mathematics both to the concrete world and to other branches of mathematics. It was also aimed to keep relatively intact the characterization of the specific domain of a branch of mathematics held by its practitioners.

However, in many cases, mathematicians themselves disagreed about the best characterization of their field of study, or wholly resisted the idea that a logical analysis of it preserved its true essence. In those cases, Whitehead and Russell often felt no compunction in presenting their own favorite analysis in logical terms, despite the dissent. They also felt no qualms about presenting various mathematical theories using logical forms that deviated greatly from the "surface structure" of the mathematical language in place prior to the analysis. According to Gandon, there were no strict or specifiable criteria used by Whitehead and Russell to determine when to favor the needs of easy logical analysis, and when instead to give preference to the desiderata imposed by pre-analyzed mathematics. Gandon contrasts this position both with the Fregean and Wittgensteinian perspectives discussed above, as well as with the philosophical approaches taken by some contemporaries to the foundations of real analysis, including Shapiro, Wright and Hale.

At certain places, Gandon worries that Russell's taking into account the applications of mathematics, and his interest in the mindset of mathematical practitioners, are in tension with his anti-psychologism, according to which psychological or practical considerations ought to play no role in our account of mathematical truth. For myself, I think this tension is not very great, and that, perhaps, Gandon slightly overplays the philosophical importance of certain decisions made by Russell in the course of outlining his logicism. Surely, for Russell, any deductive theory that can be fully analyzed in terms of logical constants, and whose basic principles can be derived from general logical laws, counts as a part of pure mathematics. This would then include even, e.g., Pasch's account of projective geometry, the Leibnizian or Kleinian accounts of metrical geometry, the purely arithmetical or Fregean accounts of real analysis, etc. Russell is not so much "rejecting" those theories as he is demurring from labeling them in a certain way: as, e.g., the "real thing". Just because Russell would reserve the label "real analysis" for one way of proceeding as opposed to another does not mean that there is something erroneous about the other ways of proceeding, or that they are not parts of pure mathematics. Russell simply allows historical, psychological and practical considerations to affect how he labels parts of pure mathematics, post-analysis. There is nothing objective or formal to dictate how we ought to label things at any stage, any more than there is anything making a name parents give their child "correct" or "incorrect". I see no serious backslide to psychologism here.

Another place where Gandon sees more tension in Russell's views than I think is warranted involves his so-called "logical universalism". This phrase is used quite often in discussion of Russell's work, but I personally find it unhelpful, as every commentator seems to mean something a little bit different by it. However, in this case, what is at issue is Russell's contention that logical truths, and by extension those of pure mathematics, must be fully general, and equally applicable to all things. This might appear to be in tension with the way in which Whitehead and Russell divide the subject matter of mathematics into different sub-areas based on the order-types of the relations they involve. If all of pure mathematics must be topic neutral, then it would seem that there cannot be more and less specific topics in mathematics.

However, again, I think this tension is not very great. The kinds of relations in question here are what Russell calls "relations-in-extension", which are to dyadic propositional functions what classes are to monadic propositional functions -- i.e., logical fictions used to facilitate simple talk about all those values of the variables in the function which satisfy it. Different order-types of such relations are classes of such relations. All these "things" are of "higher type" in Russell's type theory, and like all such "things", they are mere façons de parler, with all facts seemingly "about" them reducible to simpler facts about their members (in the case of classes) or relata (in the case of relations). Ultimately, matters inevitably come down to the individuals making up atomic facts, and with these, despite the focus on particular order-types, all mathematical claims treat different individuals entirely on a par with one another. The branch of mathematics which deals with ordinal numbers, for example, focuses on well-ordered relations, but it does not matter whether one is dealing with a well-ordering of moments of time, or pieces of fruit, or sense-data. The individual variables involved in all mathematical claims are unrestricted, and hence these claims are completely topic neutral with regard to the sorts of individuals to which they may be applied, even if they focus on a narrower range of relations-in-extension between individuals.

Despite these slight exaggerations, this is a rich and rewarding book. It is chock full of mathematical and historical details, of which I've done no more than skim the surface in this review. Gandon's writing is polished, provocative and interesting. I can heartily recommend it not only to scholars of Russell's philosophy, but to all those interested in the history of philosophy and mathematics alike.