Russell vs. Meinong: The Legacy of "On Denoting"

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Nicholas Griffin and Dale Jacquette (eds.), Russell vs. Meinong: The Legacy of "On Denoting", Routledge, 2009, 384pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415963640.

Reviewed by Berit Brogaard, Australian National University/University of Missouri, St. Louis


Russell vs. Meinong: The Legacy of "On Denoting" is a high-quality collection of fifteen essays presented at an international conference on 'Russell vs. Meinong: 100 Years after "On Denoting"', held at McMaster University, Hamilton, Ontario, Canada in 2005. The essays address Russell's theory of mathematics, Russell's theory of descriptions, the motivations underlying Meinong's object theory, and Russell's rejection of it.

One central issue taken on by several of the authors in this volume is that of locating the exact difference between Meinong's and Russell's approaches to a central claim about intentionality. We might tease out the difference between Meinong's and Russell's attitudes towards intentionality by considering the following simple argument (for simplicity's sake, I shall take 'representation and presentation' to mean 'non-reflexive and non-self-reflective representation and presentation'):[1]

The Intentionality Argument

(1) Representation and presentation (Vorstellung) always are directed toward transcendent objects.

(2) Some false representations and hallucinatory presentations are not directed toward existing transcendent objects.

(3) Hence, representation and presentation are sometimes directed towards transcendent objects that do not exist.

Meinong familiarly accepts the conclusion of the Intentionality Argument. He thinks that non-reflexive or non-self-reflective thought and experience always point toward something that transcends them. In some cases of hallucinatory experience and false thought the object that transcends the experience or thought does not exist. However, for Meinong, not all non-existing transcendent objects supervene on the mind of the perceiver or thinker, some non-existing objects have being independently of any thinker or perceiver. These include entities such as unicorns, blue swans and talking donkeys. These entities are abstract entities which subsist but do not exist. Other non-existing objects (e.g. round squares) supervene on the mind of the perceiver or thinker; they have no being independently of being an object of experience or thought.

Russell's views differ from Meinong's in all of these respects. As Omar Nasim points out in his contribution to this volume, though Russell around the turn of the century seemed to adhere to the first premise, he rejects this claim in 1903 with the publication of Principles of Mathematics. Russell here argues that unlike genuinely proper names, which denote their referents (i.e., sense data) directly, descriptions are to be treated as so-called denoting phrases. Denoting phrases denote their denotation by way of a denoting concept indicated by the phrase. The concept can fail to denote. So when employing a denoting phrase, we are related to an immanent object (i.e. a concept) that can fail to denote. Hence, denoting phrases are not directed toward objects that do not exist. In his later work on experience Russell similarly holds that experience is not directed towards transcendent objects (Russell 1912). Instead it is directed towards sense data. And no relation needs to obtain between the sense data and a transcendent object. So experience and thought are not in any interesting sense directed toward transcendent objects, they are directed toward immanent objects. Post-1903 Russell has thus become an indirect realist. All knowledge about the external world is indirect; it is knowledge via sense data or denoting concepts.

The view developed by Russell in "On Denoting" eliminates the need for denoting concepts. Russell argues that there are no denoting concepts, that is, there are no phrases which denote their denotation indirectly via a denoting concept. Description sentences are to be interpreted as different sentences in which no denoting phrase occurs: 'The teacher of Plato is wise', for example, is to be interpreted as '∃x(x is a teacher of Plato & ∀y (y is a teacher of Plato → y = x) & x is wise)'. Consequently, even though the description sentence 'the teacher of Plato is wise' is grammatically a subject-predicate sentence, it is not logically a subject-predicate sentence, because it translates into a kind of existential sentence, in which the apparent denoting phrase 'the teacher of Plato' does not occur. On Russell's new view, ordinary language masks the true logical form of the propositions it expresses. The translations replace ordinary language with a logically perfect language that truly reflects logical form. For Russell, denoting phrases are thus incomplete symbols which have no meaning in themselves; they can be defined only via a contextual definition and not directly. Russell's new theory also entails a rejection of the first premise. Denoting phrases are not directed towards transcendent objects; if it makes sense to say that denoting phrases are about anything at all, given Russell's new theory, they are about the entire domain over which the variables range.

As Graham Stevens points out, however, Russell's new theory was not 'required to escape from the Meinongian excesses commonly thought to infect the Principles of Mathematics' (p. 27). What was required to avoid Meinongianism was a rejection of the basic tenant of Austrian philosophy that non-reflexive and non-self-reflective thought and experience always reach beyond themselves. But Russell held this view several years before the publication of "On Denoting". "On Denoting" did enable Russell to avoid commitment to certain Meinongian objects. The earlier Russell was committed to non-existing entities, but as Gideon Makin argues, what made Russell accept non-existing entities was not an acceptance of the intentionality thesis accepted by Meinong but rather the existence of fictional names in the language. Russell's new theory of descriptions made it possible to avoid positing non-existing entities as the semantic values of fictional names. For Meinong, however, the theory of descriptions would have no such consequence, as he was committed to the idea that experience and thought are about something that transcends them. A thought of Sherlock Holmes is about Sherlock Holmes, it is not about all the entities in the universe.

Now on to the particular essays. What follows is a brief outline of each of the essays. Due to the limitations of this review, I can offer only exceedingly brief remarks.

Alasdair Urquhart, "Logic and Denotation", examines the contributions Russell's new theory makes to the foundations of logic. The theory Russell developed in the years immediately preceding "On Denoting" eliminates classes in favor of propositional functions, and the notion of a propositional function can be further reduced to the notions of a proposition and substitution. According to Urquhart it was Russell's hope that this new theory could help to resolve the paradoxes involving classes that Russell had encountered just after the turn of the century. However, Urquhart argues, solving these paradoxes only led to new paradoxes of substitution which the new theory could not solve.

Graham Stevens, "Anti-Realism and the Theory of Descriptions", examines the question of to what extent Russell's theory of descriptions was introduced as a means of avoiding the Meinongian jungle of excess entities. Stevens argues that the theory of descriptions isn't needed for this purpose. Rather, it is needed in order for Russell to return to his pre-1903 thesis that every constituent of the immediate objects of thought and experience are entities with which we are directly acquainted. Once one accepts this thesis one must either allow for non-existent immediate objects or alternatively turn to Russell's eliminative strategy. The introduction of the theory of descriptions, Stevens argues, thus does not mark a retreat from realism, even if it does mark a retreat from Meinong's ultra-realism.

Francis Jeffry Pelletier and Bernard Linsky, "Russell vs. Frege on Definite Descriptions as Singular Terms", look at Russell's theory of descriptions understood as a refutation of the descriptions-as-singular-terms view. After examining several versions of the singular-terms view, they look at one of Russell's actual criticisms of these theories to the effect that they entail a form of Meinongianism. The main criticism Pelletier and Linsky deal with is that if descriptions are treated as singular terms, then we are committed to non-existing entities such as kings of France, unicorns, and golden mountains. However, Pelletier and Linsky argue, this only follows if one treats description claims of the form 'the F is F' as logical truths. If one rejects this assumption one can escape the criticisms while still holding onto the descriptions-as-singular-terms thesis.

Kevin C. Klement, "A Cantorian Argument Against Frege's and Early Russell's Theories of Descriptions", argues that Cantorian diagonal paradoxes pose a problem for Russell's 1903 theory of descriptions as well as Frege's theory. The core paradox is this. By something like Cantor's powerset theorem, for any descriptive sense, the number of properties applicable (or not) to the sense exceeds the number of senses. This theorem is at odds with Fregean theories which hold that there is a descriptive sense for any property P. Klement considers various possible responses which Fregeans might offer to avoid the paradox but concludes that none is entirely satisfactory and that the Cantorian paradox thus is a further motivation for rejecting Fregean theories in favor of Russell's eliminative proposal.

Gideon Makin, " 'On Denoting': Appearance and Reality", argues that the widespread thought that the theory of "On Denoting" was introduced in order to avoid an earlier commitment to non-existing referents of denoting phrases is false. Russell was committed to non-existing entities as the referents of fictional names, and so Russell's theory resembles Meinong's in superficial respects but the motivations underlying their commitments were different. Meinong, as we have seen, was committed to non-existing entities because of his underlying commitment to the idea that experience and thought are object-directed. Russell, on the other hand, hoped to find a way to assign truth-values to sentences containing fictional names. The theory of descriptions does help with this problem, as long as one is willing to treat fictional names as descriptions in disguise. But the new theory was not introduced as a means of avoiding Meinongianism, as Russell never was committed to anything like Meinongianism.

Omar W. Nasim, "Explaining G. F. Stout's Reaction to Russell's 'On Denoting' ", addresses a historical issue, viz. that of why G. F. Stout (the editor of Mind) had a primarily negative initial reaction to Russell's "On Denoting". As we do not know much about the correspondence between Stout and Russell at the time of the publication of "On Denoting" Nasim considers an earlier letter which Stout wrote to Russell in 1903. Stout's main objection to both Russell's old theory and Russell's new theory, Nasim argues, was that they allow for the possibility that there can be representation without an object. The old theory allows for representations which do not represent anything. The new theory introduces representations which represent the whole universe (or all objects in the domain). Stout's initial reaction to Russell's theory thus did not turn on the specifics of the elimination strategy of the theory of descriptions but rather on the feature that Stout thought the new theory had in common with the old theory of denoting concepts, namely that there can be representations which do not represent an object.

David Bostock's essay "Russell on 'the' in the Plural" tells the story of how Russell developed his simple theory of types. Bostock looks at four stages of the development of the theory. The first two stages can be found in the Principles of Mathematics in chapters 4 through 6 and in Russell's concerns about the theory in the same work; the third stage is set out in "On Denoting" and the fourth stage can be found in Russell's work from 1908 to 1910, including Principia Mathematica, which he co-wrote with Whitehead. The final theory of types is free from paradox because it prohibits naming what is expressed by an expression of a different type. For example, we cannot name the property expressed by 'is wise', and then proceed to attribute properties to its referent, and we cannot name the proposition that Socrates is wise, and then proceed to attribute properties to it. One can do this in ordinary language but not in the perfect logical language of Principia Mathematica. This sort of language avoids the paradoxes that arise in languages without these restrictions. In the latter such languages one can introduce paradox-inducing names such as 'the property of not being a property of oneself' and 'the propositional function which yields true propositions just when its arguments are functions that do not apply to themselves'. If 'the property of not being a property of oneself' denotes anything, it denotes the property of not being a property of itself. If this property is not a property of itself, then it has the property of not being a property of itself. So it is not a property of itself. But if it is not a property of itself, then it is a property of itself. So it both is and is not a property of itself. In the simple theory of types this paradox does not arise, as one cannot name properties and propositional functions.

Johann Christian Marek's essay "Psychological Content and Indeterminacy with Respect to Being: Two Notes on the Russell-Meinong Debate" focuses on the Russell-Meinong debate over whether experiences have psychological contents. For Russell, experiences do not have psychological content. Experience is a relation between a subject and an object. Of course, for Russell, the object must be one with which the subject is directly acquainted, one that can be referred to by means of a logically proper name. Since the only objects with which we can be directly acquainted are sense-data, according to Russell, experience is a relation between a subject and sense-data. For Meinong, experiences have psychological content. When we think of two different objects, there is a difference in how the objects are presented in the experience, and this difference amounts to a difference in psychological content. One of the main reasons Meinong took experiences to have psychological content was that he held that the objects of experience transcend the experience. Hence, we cannot be directly acquainted with them but are acquainted with them only via their presentations. For Russell, on other hand, the objects of experience do not transcend experience. We are directly acquainted with them; hence, for him there is no need for psychological content.

Dale Jacquette, "Meditations on Meinong's Golden Mountain", examines the question of why Russell rejected Meinong's object theory and adopted a revised version of Frege's referentialist semantics. One possible answer is that Russell never fully understood the core claims of Meinong's intentionalism. Meinong's thesis, as we have seen, is best understood as a consequence of Brentano's intentionality thesis to the effect that every experience (Vorstellung), judgment and emotion is about something (setting aside self-reflective thought and the like). If every experience, judgment and emotion is about something, then some experiences, judgments and emotions are about things that do not exist, and some experiences, judgments and emotions are about things that do not subsist. As Jacquette points out, Russell took Meinong to be claiming that some things both do and don't exist, and part of the reason for this might well have been that Meinong didn't offer the best possible response to Russell's objections, which would have been to emphasize that his theory only entails that there are things that do not exist. Jacquette concludes by offering reasons for thinking Russell shouldn't have been so quick to deny Meinong's object theory. On the theory of descriptions, intuitively true sentences such as 'the golden mountain is mythological' come out as logically false. There is no logically possible world in which there exists a unique golden mountain that is mythological. But one would have thought that the question of whether the golden mountain exists or is merely mythological is empirical. It is a question which, as Jacquette puts it, is to be 'settled by explorers, scientists, historians and literary scholars' (p. 198).

Nicholas Griffin's essay "Rethinking Item Theory" argues that Meinong's object theory seems to be founded on two principles: (i) whatever assumption we make there is a thing about which it is made, and (ii) a thing has all the properties which characterize it. But these two principles together entail that true claims can be made about all sorts of things that do not exist, including golden mountains, unicorns, and so on. Assumption is free. Nicholas suggests that the solution to this problem lies in assuming that there is such a thing as a context of supposition. In some contexts of supposition, it is unproblematic to refer to non-existent entities. For example, in the context of the Conan Doyle stories, it is true that Sherlock Holmes lives on Baker Street. As Griffin points out, this solution has various advantages, among others that it can account for the intuitive truth of comparative statements such as 'Holmes is smarter than Hoover'. This sentence can be assigned a truth-value in a new context of supposition that brings in both Holmes and Hoover with the properties they have in their native contexts.

Peter Loptson, "Contra Meinong", takes issue with Meinongianism and suggests that the anti-Meinongian can avoid the most obvious putative examples in support of the position by appealing to a surplus of abstract entities, concepts and ways. When presented with a sentence such as 'Holmes is a detective' a typical speaker will judge that an alternative sentence such as 'the stories represent that Holmes is a detective' is more literal or accurate than the original Meinongian sentence. Loptson argues that this suggests that typical speakers would render the original sentence as mildly inaccurate or non-literal, contrary to what Meinongians hold.

Gabriele Contessa's essay "Who is Afraid of Imaginary Objects?" is also concerned with how best to account for Meinongian sentences. He considers a number of ways in which one can account for their intuitive truth. The approaches fall under two main categories: eliminativist approaches and hospitable approaches. Eliminativist approaches, as the name indicates, attempt to eliminate putative reference to imaginary objects e.g. by paraphrasing. Hospitable approaches grant that fictional names refer but they deny that they refer to something concrete. Instead they refer to something with a different ontological status. Contessa defends what he calls the 'dualist approach'. On this approach, imaginary objects are actual abstract objects and possible concrete objects. As actual abstract objects imaginary objects have properties such as that of having been created by an author. As possible concrete objects imaginary objects have properties such as that of being a pipe smoker and living in 221B Baker Street.

Gregory C. Landini, "Russell's Definite Descriptions de re", discusses the different projects underlying Meinong's object theory and Russell's theory of descriptions. Meinong's main motivation for his object theory stems from, as Landini puts it, 'the quest to form a theory of intentionality' (p. 282). Meinong's theory rests on the phenomenological insight that 'a thought can point towards an object other than itself' (p. 282). Russell, on the other hand, was primarily concerned with propositional structure. However, as Landini points out, there is a challenge left for Russellians, namely that of accounting for intentionality without positing Meinongian objects. This project goes beyond that of accounting for logical form. Perhaps the best way to see this is to consider experience rather than thought. If we reject the premise that every experience has a transcendent object, we are still left with the project of explaining the phenomenal datum that every experience seems to point to an object other than itself. And these cases cannot be explained away by appealing to underlying logical form.

Michael Nelson, "Quantifying in and Anti-Essentialism", looks at Quine's attack on quantified modal logic. It is commonly thought that Quine's arguments can be successfully refuted by applying Russell's theory of descriptions. Nelson argues that this is not the case. The Russellian reply involves carefully considering the scope of description sentences. However, Nelson argues, while this reply blocks Quine's arguments, it does not address Quine's real concern. Quine's real concern is that quantified modal logic requires Aristotelian essentialism, that is, it requires privileging one way of designating an object over others when determining whether the object necessarily has a given property. This flies in the face of the reductive project of grounding modality in analyticity. However, Nelson argues, Quine's concern can ultimately be laid to rest, as quantified modal logic requires only a rather innocent form of Aristotelian essentialism.

In the final chapter "Points, Complexes, Complex Points, and a Yacht" Nathan Salmon discusses 'two puzzling passages' in "On Denoting", Gray's elegy argument and Russell's case of the 'small yacht and its touchy owner'. Following is a brief version of Salmon's interpretation of the Gray's elegy argument. We cannot understand sentences that purport to be about denoting concepts. For, if one understands such a sentence, then either one grasps a proposition that is directly about the denoting concept, or one grasps a proposition that is indirectly about the denoting concept. But there cannot be a proposition that is directly about denoting concepts. For, denoting concepts by their very nature denote something other than themselves. So, the proposition that, say, the teacher of Plato is a concept predicates concepthood of Socrates. Salmon calls this step in the argument 'the collapse'. He takes this to be the crucial step in the argument. Because of the collapse, the proposition we grasp must be indirectly about the denoting concept. But such a proposition does not contain the denoting concept itself but contains instead some higher-order denoting concept that denotes the first-order denoting concept. But, for Russell, such entities are utterly mysterious. In the second part of his essay Salmon considers Russell's case of a guest who remarks that he thought that the host's yacht was larger than it is. The yacht owner replies sarcastically 'no, my yacht is not larger than it is'. Russell claims that the guest meant that the size he thought the host's yacht was is greater than the size the yacht is. However, there is a problem with this interpretation. The guest could have thought that the host's yacht was larger than it is, even if there was no particular size which the guest thought the yacht was. Salmon argues that the correct interpretation is this: There is a size r that is a unique size of your yacht, and I thought: that the size of your yacht was greater than r.

In conclusion, as can be seen from the above, the editors have produced a highly attractive, concise collection of essays which succeeds in bringing together a variety of perspectives concerning Russell's "On Denoting" and the Russell vs. Meinong debate. Each of the essays in this book is well-crafted and rich in useful insights on a number of theoretically interesting points. Although the book is often very demanding, no one interested in the motivations underlying Russell's theory of descriptions and Meinong's object theory will want to miss it.[2]


Russell, Bertrand. 1997 (1912). The Problems of Philosophy, New York: Oxford University Press.

[1] As Dale Jacquette has pointed out to me, it is not strictly true that Meinong takes experience and thought to always point toward something that transcends them. A reflexive or self-reflective thought about itself will not have a transcendent object, but rather an immanent object.

[2] Thanks to Dale Jacquette for helpful comments.