Truth, Meaning, Experience

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Anil Gupta, Truth, Meaning, Experience, Oxford University Press, 2011, 288pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195136036.

Reviewed by G. Aldo Antonelli, University of California, Davis


In this book Anil Gupta collects eight of his contributions, all of which have appeared independently over a period of twenty years (1989 -- 2009), and which span a variety of topics, from formal theories of truth to issues in classical empiricism. Collections of this sort sometimes lack a unifying theme, and while they can be effective in providing an overview of an author's work, they run the risk of leaving the reader with the impression of a somewhat disjointed effort. Fortunately, this is not the case with Truth, Meaning, Experience. There is indeed a common thread running through the book, although it might not become apparent until after working one's way through the collection. The unifying theme tying the chapters together is the development of an account of how hypothetical information can be turned into categorical information by means of an iterative revision process.

Information is often obtained only in "hypothetical" or -- perhaps a better term -- "conditional" form. Suppose we are interested in the extension of some predicate G: for instance, a truth predicate for some particular language; or a predicate encompassing the available rational moves for the players in an idealized game; or even the predicate specifying the empirical judgments to which one is rationally entitled on the basis of some experience. In such cases (all of which figure prominently in Gupta's book), we lack an explicit criterion allowing us to fix the extension of the predicate directly. On the other hand, we can often lay down some constraints that any putative extension for the predicate (a hypothesis, in the book's terminology) needs to satisfy. Such constraints, referred to as revision rules, have the following schematic form:

(R) If items a, b, c, . . . fall under G and have property P, and items x, y, z, . . . do not fall under G, and have property Q, then item e (appropriately related to a, b, c, . . . x, y, z, . . . ) falls under G.

A revision rule can be viewed as a function taking a hypothetical extension h as input and returning another extension h* as output. For instance, in a typical example, given a hypothetical extension for the truth predicate, T, we can compute which sentences, some of which might involve T itself, turn out to be true, thereby establishing a new extension for T. If the hypothetical extension for T contains the sentence "snow is white," then the new extension will contain the sentence "'snow is white' is true;" and if the hypothetical extension contains the sentence "this sentence is not true," then the new extension will not contain that very same sentence.

Revision rules clearly exhibit a form of circularity, since the definiendum, G, is used to determine whether a given item e falls under G. The circularity itself need not be pathological. For instance, revision rules generalize in a natural way inductive constructions widely employed in mathematics and other fields of formal inquiry. In fact, the general form of inductive definitions can be obtained from the form (R) by dropping the negative condition about items x, y, z, . . . not falling under G, for then the extension of G can be obtained by a bottom-up construction in which items are successively added by repeated application of the rule (a comparison to such constructions is articulated in chapter 5 in the context of Gupta's response to some criticisms by Martin and McGee). But in the general case, it is of course possible that adding some items to the extension of G might invalidate the conditions on which other items are added.

Revision rules provide the foundation of Gupta's general approach, an approach that when applied to the notion of truth goes under the name of "Revision Theory of Truth," and that can be traced back to early work by Gupta himself and (independently) Herzberger in the early 1980's, further developed in collaboration with Belnap. I'll refer to the general approach also as Revision Theory (although Gupta seems to reserve the name for the special case of truth), the basic notions of which, readily extended to "circularly defined concepts" besides truth, are outlined in chapters 3 and 4.

A crucial idea of Revision Theory is that revision rules improve upon hypothetical extensions, so that h* is -- in some appropriate sense -- better than h as a candidate for the extension of G. But of course the improvement is still relative to the starting point, h. So the other component of the theory is the idea that the conditional character of the information provided by the revision rule can be weeded out by considering multiple iterative processes, each one of which begins with an arbitrary initial hypothesis h, repeatedly applying (R) to obtain a sequence of hypotheses h, h*, h**, . . . , a sequence that could be in principle extend indefinitely.

To see how the two ideas come together, call a hypothesis h "reflexive" if h itself is the result of applying the revision rule to h some finite, non-zero, number of times (as a special case we have the "fixed-points" of the revision rule, i.e., those hypothesis that are left unchanged by one application of the rule). Reflexive hypotheses, then, are those that survive the weeding-out process. Although this will not, in general, give us a single hypothesis h, i.e., it will not fix the extension of our predicate G categorically, it will give us a salient class of candidates for such an extension -- the class of all reflexive hypotheses -- so that it makes sense to investigate what would have to be true no matter which hypothesis in the salient class is chosen as the extension of G. We can thus obtain some judgments, assertions, or propositions that receive some kind of categorical sanction, and in which the hypothetical or conditional character of the revision rule is eliminated.

This general framework is put to work in the book to provide an analysis of a number of circularly defined concepts. As mentioned, the original, and to this day perhaps the foremost, application of Revision Theory is to the concept of truth. Gupta's and Belnap's The Revision Theory of Truth (MIT Press, 1993) is an extensive, technically sophisticated and philosophically deep treatment of truth from the point of view of Revision Theory, but the topic is given an accessible presentation in the opening chapters of Truth, Meaning, Experience. The revision rule that characterizes such a treatment of truth is the one (mentioned above) that maps hypothetical extensions of the truth predicate into hypothetical extensions, using the input hypothesis to interpret sentences of the object language containing the truth predicate. There is clearly a similarity between such a rule of revision and the Tarski biconditionals for a language L, viz., the statements of the form

(*) s is true in L if and only if S,

where s is a name (in L) for the L-sentence S. Gupta argues, in fact, that the revision rule captures the essential meaning and import of the biconditionals, in allowing us to improve upon hypothetical extensions of "true" in the manner described. However, one should be careful with the proper interpretation of the biconditionals: in particular, Gupta warns us that we cannot take the biconditionals as collectively providing a definition for the notion of truth, and in particular that they should not be taken to have propositional character.

As is well known, the biconditionals have also been called into service in support of a deflationist conception of truth, i.e., the view that truth is not a substantial notion, and that its meaning is exhausted by the disquotation provided by the biconditionals. Gupta challenges the deflationist conception of truth by arguing, especially in chapter 1, that deflationism is based on an equivocation: whereas one can plausibly maintain that the biconditionals play a role in fixing the extension of the truth predicate (just as Revision Theory would have it), the stronger claim that they fix the meaning of truth, i.e., that they provide a definition, is in fact open to a number of objections. But it is the latter, stronger claim that the deflationists need, although their arguments provided only support the former, weaker claim.

The other half of the two-pronged argument in favor of a revision-theoretic approach to truth is given in a short, but remarkable paper, "An Argument Against Tarski's Convention T," which appears in the book as chapter 2. Tarski's Convention T is the requirement that any extensionally adequate definition of truth must imply (in conjunction with appropriate extra-logical resources) all biconditionals of the form (*) above (as well as the further principle that anything falling in the extension of the truth predicate must be a sentence). In a bit of technical wizardry, Gupta shows that any extensionally adequate definition of truth must fail to imply some biconditional, thereby refuting Convention T. (Gupta also gives a ramped-up version of the argument in which the proposed definition is assumed to be intensionally adequate.) The upshot is that the Tarski biconditionals, while essential to our grasping the signification of truth, cannot be construed as expressing a principle given in propositional form, a principle that would then be able to enter into various forms of entailment relations with other propositions. Rather, the argument goes, they should be construed as providing a rule for improving on hypothetical candidates for the extension of truth.

The argument from chapter 2 has an unexpected counterpart in chapter 6, where Gupta develops a clever scenario aimed at challenging established philosophical views about the relation between language and the world, as well as at overcoming traditional philosophical oppositions such as the one between realism and anti-realism. In fact, according to Gupta, both realism and anti-realism share the view that language can "engage the world" only through the medium of representation, a claim the plays a role in the realists' modus ponens just as much as it does in the anti-realists' modus tollens.

Gupta successfully sidesteps this claimed connection by introducing the notion of a frame -- a technical device intended to bridge the gap between linguistic meaning (even allowing for meaning to be determined by context) and linguistic content. The argument is expounded at length in the chapter, and it cannot be even summarily rehearsed here; but in spite of this lengthy treatment the reader is left wanting for more detail in articulating the notion of a frame, given the crucial role the notion plays in the account.

While the development of Revision Theory has been motivated by the analysis of the concept of truth, Gupta has claimed all along that the theory provides a general tool for the analysis of circularly defined concepts (for instance, such a claim is a crucial part of the argument developed in collaboration with Belnap in their co-authored 1993 book). Such applications, however, have been few and far between -- a fact that is thrown even more into relief by the indisputable success of Revision Theory as applied to the concept of truth. It is all the more important, then, for the reader to appreciate the crucial role played in the book's overall argument by the second half of chapter 4, where Gupta develops some ideas (initially also due to André Chapuis) aimed at showing that the concept of strategic rationality, as employed for instance in game and decision theory, is an intrinsically circular concept, which can therefore be given an analysis in terms of revision rules.

It is intuitively clear that there is some circularity involved in the notion of strategic rationality. For instance, as students of decision theory quickly realize, what is a rational move for player I in a given 2-person game depends on what moves are rational for player II in the same game, and vice-versa; the very notion of a Nash equilibrium exhibits this interdependence of the players' strategic options. This basic intuition can be made precise by means of a revision rule, and while it is not completely straightforward to do so (the reader is referred Gupta's book for details), this particular application of the basic notions of Revision Theory enjoys one great advantage over other possible applications, namely the possibility of a visually compelling representation of the reflexive hypotheses relative to a given game. This is clearest in the case of 2-person strict games in normal form, in which a given hypothesis as to the extension of the rationality predicate (specifying which pair of moves for players I and II counts as rational) can be mapped to a different extension (i.e., a different pair of moves for I and II). If we represent such mappings in the form of arrows arranged on a path through the normal-form representation of the game, then reflexive hypotheses are those that lie on a loop.

This particular application of Revision Theory to the concept of strategic rationality appears to be potentially quite illuminating. Just as in the case of truth, we have a widely studied important concept on which Revision Theory can cast some new light. Consider for instance those hypotheses that are left unchanged by one application of the revision rule (viz., the fixed points of the revision process). In the case of strategic rationality one immediately sees that any such fixed point must be a Nash equilibrium. Moreover, in games where there is exactly one reflexive hypothesis, such a hypothesis must be a Nash equilibrium as well, and conversely. But perhaps the most interesting result of the chapter is the claim that revision processes can sometimes yield results even when the standard tools and methods of game and decision theory, e.g., the iterated elimination of dominated strategies, fall short (p. 115). The discussion in the chapter is rich and far-reaching, and one would expect that as the connection becomes more known, game and decision theorists might be persuaded to explore the consequences of the revision-theoretic approach in more detail.

The last two chapters of the book, chapters 7 and 8, deal with another application of the main view, this time (in a somewhat unexpected twist) to issues in epistemology. It should be mentioned that this topic was already treated at length in Gupta's Empiricism and Experience (Oxford UP, 2006), but the presentation of chapter 7 is clear and accessible (chapter 8 contains Gupta's rebuttals to some criticisms). The epistemological view presented here is a perhaps striking articulation of the basic idea of Revision Theory -- that iteration allows us to turn hypothetical or conditional information into categorical information. Gupta's starting point is the observation that our ordinary perceptual judgments are shaped by a combination of "the given" in experience with the system of our pre-existing beliefs, which collectively form what Gupta refers to as a view. As originally observed by Frege, the combination of two items to yield a third one requires that one of the initial items be functional in nature, in order that it might be applied to the other one as its argument. Gupta chooses to assign the functional role to the given, and reserve the role of the argument for the complex of our beliefs, i.e., the view. The other choice clearly is also possible (another Fregean point). Gupta does not explain the reasons why he does not pursue the latter option is, although one can plausibly surmise that our views have a "saturated" nature that make them more apt to play the role of arguments than that of a function.

Be that as it may, the conception of the given as a function mapping views to judgment is in keeping with other claims in the book, for instance that the Tarski biconditionals do not have propositional nature, or that the engagement of language with the world is similarly decoupled from its representational role. Once the functional character of the given is assumed, it becomes clear that the given similarly lacks propositional content (contra what Gupta dubs the Cartesian conception), and that it is hypothetical in nature instead. By now one can see where this is going: the possibility of applying the given to a particular view to yield a system of perceptual judgments is quite like a rule of revision, a fact which allows us to weed out, by iteration, a number of views (just like, for instance, in the case of truth revision, processes rule out certain candidates for the extension of the truth predicate).

Even if this were all that there is to this application of the revision-theoretic approach to the issue of rational justification of empirical judgments, it would still be a valuable contribution. But Gupta strikes philosophical pay dirt when he considers the implications for the prospects of empiricism. As he puts it, "with the hypothetical given, empiricism gains a fighting chance" (p. 228). Classical empiricism struggles because of its acceptance of the Cartesian view according to which the given in experience is propositional in nature. Gupta points out that the only coherent account along these lines leads us either into "the clutches of skepticism" or to "embrace idealism or its twentieth-century descendant, phenomenalism" (p. 205). But on the hypothetical conception of the given, empiricism can access a rich, complex, and structured notion of experience, as well as a conception of reason that is not limited to providing purely logical constraints, but without at the same time allowing for substantial a priori truths about the world. On this conception, reason is intimately involved in running the revision process, selecting recurring hypotheses and ruling out hypotheses, such as solipsism, that do not engage with the world and are therefore left untouched by experience. There is clearly a bit of a risk of a vicious circle here, if our conception of empirically warranted judgments relies on ruling out hypotheses that do not engage with experience. The circularity is only apparent, though, in that the requirement can be stated in purely revision-theoretic terms, and independently of the kind of empiricism it is supposed to support; but the impression remains that the hypotheses that are fixed under all experiences are being ruled out in a bit of Carnapian fiat.