Sacrifice and Self-Interest in Seventeenth-Century France: Quietism, Jansenism, and Cartesianism

Sacrifice And Self Interest

Thomas M. Lennon, Sacrifice and Self-Interest in Seventeenth-Century France: Quietism, Jansenism, and Cartesianism, Brill, 2019, 318pp., $139.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004400962.

Reviewed by C. P. Ragland, Saint Louis University


In Exodus, after the Israelites worship a golden calf, Moses intercedes with God on their behalf, saying "please forgive their sin -- but if not, then blot me out of the book you have written" (32:32). Similarly, in Romans, Paul says "I could wish that I myself were cursed and cut off from Christ for the sake of my people" (9:3). Moses and Paul would sacrifice their own well-being to save the people they loved. Clement of Alexandria later transposed this selfless commitment to others into a selfless commitment to God:

someone perfectly spiritual would not choose this state or perfection because he wishes to be saved . . . if asked as a kind of Impossible Supposition which of the two he would choose, perfection . . . or eternal salvation, . . . without hesitation he would choose perfection. (36)

Spiritual perfection consists in loving God for God's own sake, not as a means to one's own salvation.

Clement's "Impossible Supposition" serves as the philosophical point of departure for Thomas Lennon's fascinating historical study of the seventeenth-century controversy between Quietists and Jansenists -- the first such study in English. Quietists insisted with Clement that it is possible to love God "purely," with no hint of self-interest. As the best-known Quietist François Fénelon put it, "One can love God with a love that is pure charity . . . . One would love Him as much, even on the Impossible Supposition that He . . . willed to make eternally unhappy those who might love Him." (3) Jansenists like Antoine Arnauld, Pascal, and Jacques-Bénigne Bossuet thought that even our most noble human acts seek our own good in some way, so that the Quietists' "sacrifice of self . . . cannot be achieved" (ix). Rather than concluding that the best possible human love is impure, the Jansenists rejected the Quietists' standard of purity.

Lennon's book aims to give both a "chronological history" of this debate and a "conceptual account" of the central philosophical issues at play in it. Lennon maintains that because all sides agreed that loving is a form of willing, "the pure love debate was driven by two different conceptions of the human will" (xiii). Quietists were libertarians and Jansenists were compatibilists (though both sides agreed that "freedom is the ability to do otherwise" (xiv) in some sense). Both camps were profoundly influenced by Descartes and the ambiguities in his writings about freedom. As Lennon puts it: "Cartesians supplied the conceptual terms of the debate" (x). So another of Lennon's goals is to "understand what Descartes was up to by looking at the Quietist debate" (xiv) and vice versa.

The opening chapters of the book nicely connect the Quietist controversy to contemporary discussions and issues, including the prisoner's dilemma (25-27), moral saints (27-29), and secular variations of the impossible supposition in Mill, Kant, and Harry Frankfurt (36-41). However, the book's primary focus is on historical detail, including non-philosophical factors like personal vendettas and the multifaceted political dimensions of the controversy (18-25).

In chapter three, Lennon traces the opening of the debate to François de Sales. De Sales is arguably the first significant author of the period to advance the Impossible Supposition as a criterion for pure love, and his reception by the church set up a tension then ran through the subsequent debate. On the one hand, the church canonized de Sales. On the other, it subsequently censured several teachings associated with Quietism. The two most famous opponents in the debate can be seen as giving opposed takes on de Sales' legacy. The Quietist Fénelon reasoned via modus ponens that since de Sales endorsed Quietism and the church canonized him, the church could not possibly condemn Quietism. Bossuet, on the other hand, reasoned via modus tollens that since Quietism was worthy of censure, it could not truly be found in the teachings of a saint like de Sales (59-60). Lennon includes an extensive discussion of Madame Jeanne Guyon's role in this dispute.

Lennon then takes a deep dive (chapters four and five) into the two views of freedom: Molinism or "liberty of indifference" (the libertarian view) and Jansenism or "liberty of spontaneity" (the compatibilist view). Drawing on figures like Luis de Molina, Ockham, Guillaume Gibieuf, and Cornelius Jansenius, Lennon paints a careful and detailed picture of how disputes about free will and grace evolved from the late middle ages into seventeenth-century France. Lennon's examinations of Gibieuf's De libertate Dei et creaturae (1630) and Jansenius' Augustinus (1640) are the most extensive I have seen in English, and are extremely helpful in providing context for understanding Descartes' remarks about freedom in the Meditations (1641). A thorough treatment of debates between Arnauld and Issac Habert makes clear how the parties' different conceptions of freedom require also different understandings of divine grace.

Lennon devotes a full chapter (six) to Descartes' conception of freedom. Though I am not myself persuaded by it, Lennon makes the best case I have seen for a compatibilist reading of Descartes, largely through his effective use of historical context. Among previous commentators, those favoring a compatibilist reading have sometimes pointed to parallels between Descartes and Gibieuf (a compatibilist), while those favoring a libertarian reading have flagged Descartes' apparent agreement with the (libertarian Jesuit) Denis Petau. None working in English have so thoroughly and carefully presented the relevant passages of all three thinkers together. Lennon powerfully leverages the similarities with Gibieuf and neutralizes appeals to Petau.

Another chapter focuses on Malebranche, who occasionally wrote passages with a "Quietist ring" (for example: "It is not enough to love order when it agrees with our self-love. We must sacrifice to it everything . . .") (191). Such passages led his disciple François Lamy to construe Malebranche as a Quietist, a characterization to which Malebranche strongly objected in a protracted interchange with Lamy. Lennon takes a close look at Malebranche's conception of the will itself, showing that for Malebranche, "the Impossible Supposition is . . . a nonstarter" (186). The Malebranche that emerges is profoundly anti-Quietist, despite his equally strong opposition to the Jansenist Arnauld's view of grace. This chapter also contains a helpful survey of ways in which these and other thinkers of the period tried to distinguish between good and bad love of the self (amour propre vs. amour de soi).

Chapter eight concerns Bossuet, "the major figure in the politico-theological effort to have Quietism condemned" (203). Was he, as one might expect given Lennon's central thesis, a Jansenist about the will? After a careful survey of Bossuet's own (somewhat ambiguous) writings and an overview of the debates in which Bossuet engaged, Lennon presents what he takes to be "smoking-musket evidence" of Bossuet's Jansenist sympathies.

By the end of the seventeenth century, all three of the movements in Lennon's subtitle -- Cartesianism, Jansenism, and Quietism -- had been condemned in some way by the Roman Catholic church. Chapter nine explains these condemnations and the subsequent shift in the debate away from "substantive issues concerning the nature of grace" and towards personalities and "questions of who held what" (243). Lennon shows how all sides began to make use of a distinction between questions de droit and questions de fait -- between matters of doctrine (where Papal authority could not be challenged) and matters of fact about the meaning of texts (where it could, and was). It is a sad story of how "an original, high-minded and abstract debate" degenerated into "a repetitious, base, and almost vulgar campaign" (257).

Lennon's final chapter takes a close look at the inner logic of Quietism. Lennon notes a striking parallel between the Quietist view of pure love and Kant's theory of the good will, which acts solely from the motive of duty. Just as the Quietists aimed to love God even should doing so bring no satisfaction (even if it brought damnation!), for Kant a truly virtuous agent would do what duty demands even if doing so satisfied no inclination. Based in part on this comparison, Lennon suggests that Quietism was committed to a kind of self-regard that rendered impossible "love simply as the performance of a duty" (274) and turned "extreme sacrifice" into a "form of self-aggrandizement" (275). In other words, Quietists were doomed to fall short of their own ideals.

Though it becomes clear that Lennon's sympathies lie more with the Jansenist side, his account of these debates is even-handed and philosophically careful. It is also clearly based on a long, painstaking program of historical research involving a staggering number of primary thinkers and texts (along with extensive engagement in French and English secondary literature). This richness of historical data is the book's great strength but poses difficulties for organization. Sometimes this reader would lose the thread of a section's theme in the slightly tangential twists and turns moving from one thinker to another to another, from secondary to primary texts, from the voices of those Lennon glosses to his own voice. Lennon sometimes refers to concepts repeatedly prior to defining them (example: the droit/fait distinction appears four times before being explained), which can make his earlier points difficult to absorb for readers not already familiar with the material.

On the whole the riches of historical context and detail in the book far outweigh the organizational issues. I commend Lennon especially for his work on the divided/composite sense distinction in discussions of necessity in the period, a distinction both highly significant and maddeningly difficult to understand. Lennon's excellent book is a must-read for anyone working on issues of the will or moral psychology in seventeenth-century continental thinkers, and a helpful exploration of historical background for today's philosophers working on similar topics.