Sacrifice Regained: Morality and Self-interest in British Moral Philosophy from Hobbes to Bentham

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Roger Crisp, Sacrifice Regained: Morality and Self-interest in British Moral Philosophy from Hobbes to Bentham, Oxford University Press, 2019, 233pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198840473.

Reviewed by Robert Shaver, University of Manitoba


Roger Crisp's excellent book concerns the relation between morality and self-interest in the British Moralists -- there are chapters on Hobbes, More, Cumberland, Locke, Mandeville, Shaftesbury, Butler, Hutcheson, (Samuel) Clarke, Reid, Hume, Smith, Price, and Gay/Tucker/ Paley/Bentham. Each chapter begins with a critical account of the moral theory of the moralist, followed by a critical discussion of the moralist's view of the relation between morality and self-interest.

Some are rational egoists; some give no normative role to self-interest; many are dualists, holding that both self-interest and morality give reasons. Of the dualists, some think that in cases of conflict, morality wins; some think self-interest holds a veto; others think that morality and self-interest each win in different cases. Before Hume, everyone thinks that self-interest and morality never conflict, either because they are rational egoists, or because of facts about our world (such as the special pleasures attached to virtue) or about an afterlife. (There is a nice taxonomy of positions on 154-55.)

Crisp has read an extraordinary amount of the secondary literature on each moralist, addressed mainly in extensive footnotes. We get his take, in response to the literatures, on standard passages such as Butler's "cool hour" and Hume's reply to the sensible knave, and his take on standard issues, such as whether Hume is a utilitarian of some sort (he is -- a motive utilitarian). But Crisp also pays attention to a host of more obscure passages. Even readers not so concerned with the relation between morality and self-interest will benefit from the state-of-the-art treatments of the moral theories. You can piece together a fine short history of utilitarianism from the chapters on Cumberland, Hutcheson, Hume, Gay, Tucker, Paley and Bentham (and a short history of objections to utilitarianism from the chapters on Butler, Smith, and Price). And you can trace histories of certain strategies, such as (remarkably common) split-level defences of psychological egoism, rational egoism, or consequentialism.

Compared to some histories of the same period, such as those by Schneewind and Darwall, Crisp stays closer to the texts, and to the issues as seen by the moralists themselves.[1] The moralists are not dimly grasping Kantian thoughts teased out by pro-Kantian historians. Nor, in contrast to Irwin, are they regrettably falling away from Aristotelian insights.[2] Crisp argues that, for example, Shaftesbury's psychological egoism and denial of self-sacrifice show uncritical reliance on Aristotle's mistaken views.

The hero is Hume, but on the relation between morality and self-interest, Hume's innovation is simple -- he drops the afterlife, hence allowing for morality to call for real sacrifices in one's well-being. Others, such as Hutcheson and Samuel Clarke, had (very reluctantly) conceded that morality and self-interest might conflict in this world. Hume captures the common sense position -- hence "sacrifice regained" -- though, amazingly, one rarely found in philosophers of the period (or in the ancients).

Crisp uncovers many quirky views. Shaftesbury holds that, like memory, "continuity of correct moral opinion is required for identity over time" (87). Hutcheson admits differences in quality between pains as well as between pleasures. He suggests that "punishment of the wicked in the afterlife may . . . deter any potentially vicious rational spectators in the universe who may be influenced by what they see of human life" (112). The appeal of impartiality for Hutcheson is in part due to his ethical aestheticism: "Impartiality has a certain dignity or nobility, which can be explicated in analogy with architecture: 'the most perfect Rules of Architecture condemn an excessive Profusion of Ornament on one Part, above the Proportion of the Whole'" (116). Price holds that "any degree of 'partial virtue' is morally equivalent to any other," in part because the "habitual breach of one moral law shows that, if the agent had equally strong temptation to do wrong in other areas, he would so do" (177, 178). (Crisp comments that Price "appears to have raised the bar so high that not only those with partial virtue, but also many, and perhaps all, of those with apparently full virtue . . . are unqualified for bliss," since there is probably "some degree of temptation . . . sufficient to motivate any agent in any circumstances to act wrongly" (178).) Tucker is a luck egalitarian about rewards in the afterlife, and holds that these rewards are derived from benefits in this life. If I sacrifice now for the greater welfare of others, I gain in the afterlife, since I have increased the total benefits to be redistributed.

Crisp's critical points are frequent, quick and incisive. Following are four examples.

(1) Mandeville thinks virtuous agents sacrifice worldly pleasures, but also that "they are making no true sacrifice at all, since what they are giving up is of no value, and what they gain instead is of the greatest value to them." It is not clear why those who make no sacrifice are so admirable, and why, if worldly pleasures are of no value, the virtuous person concerns herself with helping others get them (71).  

(2) Butler suggests that loving one's neighbour as oneself might be understood as equality of affection. He thinks you can have equality of affection and your own particular affections, with the latter allowing you to favour yourself. His view, then, seems to be "equality of weight to the general principles of self-love and benevolence, such that in any decision, leaving particular affections out of it, one might choose by tossing a coin." Crisp notes that it is bizarre to think that "the weight of each of the general principles in any real situation could be entirely independent of the particular passions . . . concerned." Say I can greatly benefit myself or slightly benefit you, or say I can greatly benefit you or slightly benefit myself. Equality of affection should not call for neutrality in both cases (102).

(3) Price argues that because the goods and evils in the afterlife are infinite, "the value of any chance for it must be likewise infinite." Crisp comments that if "Price persuades me that I will be punished for eternity for vice, how can I avoid being motivated, to some degree, by that belief, which may itself put me at risk of that very punishment for failing to act in the morally correct way?" (185)

(4) Price holds that God instills deontological principles in us "to secure the general welfare." The consequentialist can note that if so, "God would ensure that we believed them anyway, thus undercutting any epistemic case for them based on our own judgments" (173).

I turn next to minor reservations I have.

(1) Crisp might have considered John Clarke. Clarke is a psychological and rational egoist who criticises Samuel Clarke and Hutcheson. He gives much clearer arguments for rational egoism than Hobbes. For example, the

only seeming Reason that can be alleged [for sacrifice], is that such an Adherence to Virtue, tho' attended with nothing but Pain and Misery to a Man's Self, may yet be good for others . . . Very true, but what then? this can be . . . no Reason, no Motive to a man to act at all.[3]

It is no (justifying) reason because, given psychological egoism, it cannot motivate, and reasons must be able to motivate.[4] Psychological egoism not only defeats non-egoistic justifying reasons, but also suggests a justifying reason itself: the agent's happiness, being "the strongest Motive possible for Action, it is most apparently very reasonable and fit" to pursue only one's happiness (Clarke, 13).

(2) I was not always convinced by Crisp's interpretations. Three examples:

(i) Against Kavka's claim that Hobbes's response to the Foole suggests that second performance in a covenant in the state of nature is rational, Crisp objects that

Hobbes begins his response by stating that he and the Foole are not discussing 'promises mutuall' in the state of nature, since such promises are not covenants. So when he goes on to mention the case of first-party performance, we must understand this to be the fulfilling of a genuine covenant, made in the presence of a coercive power. (19n27)

But the context of the Foole includes a covenant in the state of nature -- "the question is . . . where one of the parties has performed already, or where there is a power to make him perform" -- which explains the argument Hobbes gives for second performance, appealing to the need for confederates "in a condition of war" (Leviathan 15.5). Crisp is trying to reconcile Hobbes's claim that covenants in the state of nature are void with the argument for second performance (and so, perhaps, first performance) given to the Foole. It seems preferable to think that covenants are void in the sense that no one would perform first given reasonable suspicion that second performance will not occur. Hobbes could say that and say that second performance is rational. He writes that "If a covenant be made wherein neither of the parties perform presently, but trust one another, in the condition of mere nature . . . upon any reasonable suspicion it is void," implying it is not void in the absence of reasonable suspicion (Leviathan 14.18).

(ii) Crisp's section on Hobbes's rational egoism argues that Hobbes takes reason to require me to pursue my own happiness (14-17). Arguing that reason requires an end is not needed to show that Hobbes is a rational egoist. Hobbes might think that reason is merely instrumental, but that, given psychological egoism, I have reason only to bring about my own happiness. Thinking that reason is not merely instrumental also brings an extra cost -- given that reason can dictate ends independent of my desires, why does it dictate only that I bring about my own happiness? Hobbes owes us an argument. I am also not convinced that, for Hobbes, reason does require an end. Crisp notes passages in which Hobbes writes of reason as forbidding what is destructive of one's life (15-16), but one could say the same thing by combining the merely instrumental view of reason with psychological egoism.

(iii) Crisp attributes a dualist view to Hume, with self-interested and moral reasons rightly winning in different cases. The evidence for thinking self-interested reasons win is not wholly convincing. Crisp notes that Hume admits cases in which "the strict laws of justice are suspended . . . and give place to the stronger motives of necessity and self-preservation" (156). Hume's examples involve ignoring property claims in shipwrecks or in cities experiencing famine, falling into the clutches of ruffians or a state at war with barbarians, and criminal punishment. His point is that justice in these cases is "no longer of use to his own safety or that of others" (Enquiry 3.8-11). If so, a utilitarian would agree that justice ought not to be respected. There is no need to think that Hume is backing self-interest against morality. Moreover, Hume's point concerns justice in particular -- in the famine and shipwreck cases, he writes that "every man can now provide for himself by all the means, that prudence can dictate, or humanity permit" (Enquiry 3.9). Humanity limits the pursuit of self-interest.[5] Crisp also notes passages in which Hume concedes that morality is not in one's self-interest, but Hume does not say that reasons of self-interest rightly win (156-7). And one might read the discussion of "interested obligation" and the knave, for example, as relevant to motivating people, but not to what we have justifying reason to do.

(3) Crisp writes that "one hope I have is to encourage further work on the British moralists as sources of inspiration for work on self-interest or well-being and normative or first-order ethics in general" (3). He "hope[s] that this book has shown how much the British moralists still have to contribute" to the "central debate in normative ethics -- as between rational egoism, deontology, consequentialism, and various forms of dualism" (205). The book certainly does this -- but here I note some limitations, often made evident by Crisp's own criticisms.

Many of the moralists argue that self-interest and morality do not conflict in this world. As Crisp repeatedly shows, these arguments fail. Again, many of the moralists are psychological egoists, but give little defence of psychological egoism. (The view is so common that one wants some explanation of why it was so attractive.) And again, some are rational egoists, and many think self-interest at least gives some independent reason, but arguments are in short supply. When Crisp objects to Cumberland's impartialism, he cites none of the moralists here, but rather Sidgwick. There is also a relevance worry: some of the central problems the moralists deal with -- for example, how to combine moral reasons with psychological egoism, or how virtuous motivation can be other regarding while I believe that virtue always pays -- are no longer pressing.

Crisp notes that most of the moralists are hedonists about well-being. Cumberland, Shaftesbury, and Reid are exceptions. But one looking for arguments against (or for) hedonism will not find too much. Reid does best: that virtue is "a constituent of well-being" can be seen by considering "what you would wish as the greatest good for a close relative or friend: a life of honour, rather than a life of sensual pleasure (or, presumably, though Reid does not say this, a vicious life containing sensual and other kinds of pleasure)" (135). And Shaftesbury and Hutcheson seem to prefigure hybrid views: for Shaftesbury, "happiness consists in pleasurable experiences arising from valuable objects" (85); for Hutcheson, "Only pleasures are valuable, but their value depends not only on their being pleasant, but on their dignity [virtuousness]" (126). Crisp comments on Hutcheson -- the same could go for Reid -- that the approval we feel "may be grounded on our view of the morality of [the] actions rather than whether [the agent] himself benefited from them" (127). This is an excellent point, but it is one which we would have hoped the moralists themselves would address. Similarly, one might expect hybrid theorists to address the worry that innocent pleasures taken in, say, the smell of a rose, seem to contribute to well-being. (Perhaps Hutcheson could hold that any innocent pleasure makes some contribution, but the contribution is magnified when taken in virtue.)

(4) The index is minimal. It contains very few of the many authors of secondary sources whom Crisp deals with, and what it does contain is very incomplete -- for example, "hedonism" gets two page-listings. A better index would also make it easier to trace the contributions of different moralists to the same issue.

* * * * * * * * * * *

Crisp's history does show that rational egoism, a sensible deontology (Price), consequentialism, and various dualist views were the standard options. One sees why Sidgwick structured the Methods, and took egoism as seriously, as he did. What seems surprising is how quickly things changed after Sidgwick. Both egoist and dualist views largely disappeared. Crisp, I think, regrets this: he calls for a "return to the morality [vs. self-interest] question," and himself contributes greatly, both here and elsewhere, to that return (4).[6] But one theme from his history at least partly explains the change. Without God's design and an afterlife, there is no pressure to think that virtue must pay nor reason to think it always does. This leaves the counter-intuitive verdicts of egoism and veto egoism exposed.[7] And without the aim of giving God a job, there is less reason to endorse egoism or veto egoism in the first place.


Thanks to Roger Crisp and Joyce Jenkins for helpful comments.

[1] J. B. Schneewind, The Invention of Autonomy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998); Stephen Darwall, The British Moralists and the Internal "Ought" (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995).

[2] T. H. Irwin, The Development of Ethics, v. 2 (Oxford: Clarendon, 2008).

[3] John Clarke, The Foundation of Morality in Theory and Practice (York: T. Gent, 1726), 22.

[4] Crisp suggests this argument (7), but does not attribute it to any of the moralists.

[5] The infamous "weaker creatures" passage suggests a non-utilitarian account of justice -- it seems justice must be in the interest of all parties to apply -- but again, this is not a point about morality as opposed to self-interest, but rather about justice. The stronger are still "bound by the laws of humanity" (Enquiry 3.18). Crisp does note that "it is not the case that anything goes, morally speaking" (156).

[6] See, for example, Roger Crisp, Reasons and the Good (Oxford: Clarendon, 2006), ch. 5.

[7] It also leaves at least utilitarian morality exposed to cases of large sacrifice to one for small gains to many (47-8).