Sagehood: The Contemporary Significance of Neo-Confucian Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Stephen C. Angle, Sagehood: The Contemporary Significance of Neo-Confucian Philosophy, Oxford UP, 2009, 293 pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195385144.

Reviewed by Bryan W. Van Norden, Vassar College



In 1990, when Lee H. Yearley published Mencius and Aquinas: Theories of Virtue and Conceptions of Courage (SUNY Press), his claim that ancient Confucians could productively be compared to Western virtue ethicians was uncommon and controversial. Now, however, this view has become almost standard. Indeed, 2007 saw the publication of three books exploring early Confucianism from the perspective of virtue ethics: The Ethics of Confucius and Aristotle: Mirrors of Virtue (Routledge) by Jiyuan Yu, Remastering Morals with Aristotle and Confucius (Cambridge) by May Sim, and Virtue Ethics and Consequentialism in Early Chinese Philosophy (Cambridge) by the author of this review. Stephen C. Angle’s Sagehood is an extension of this general approach to the later Neo-Confucians, particularly those of the Song and Ming Dynasties (CE 960-1279, 1368-1644). But Angle is doing much more than following a trend. His work is a significant contribution to the dialogue, and one that will be of interest not only to specialists in Chinese thought but also to “mainstream” philosophers interested in the virtues, ethical cultivation, and flourishing.

The book is divided into three parts: I. Keywords, II. Ethics and Psychology, and III. Education and Politics. In each section, Angle shows his solid training in both analytic ethics and Sinology, along with his ability to make his topics clear and accessible to multiple audiences. For example, in his discussion of the key term “sage”, Angle presents a learned but readable account of the historical development of this concept that makes use of the best English and Chinese-language scholarship. He then discusses whether Confucian sages are examples of the sort of “moral saints” that Susan Wolf criticizes as being narrow and almost inhuman. Angle’s response is that Confucian sagehood is a much more well-rounded and desirable ideal — imagine someone friendly and humorous, but also possessed of integrity and compassion. The other key terms discussed in Part I of the book are “Virtue”, “harmony” and what he translates as “coherence”. (I’ll say more about this last term below.)

Part II of the book is divided into three sections. In the first, Angle brings Neo-Confucians into dialogue with Michael Slote and Iris Murdoch. Neo-Confucians are similar to Slote in advocating a kind of “balanced caring”, which acknowledges the ethical legitimacy of greater concern for family members than for strangers. Murdoch, in turn, shares with Neo-Confucians a concern for the importance of cultivating our ability to bring a “loving attention” to the world that will help us overcome the distorting veil of selfishness. However, Angle argues that both Slote and Murdoch would be well served by adopting the Neo-Confucian emphasis on a reverential attitude toward the potential harmony among things in the world. This would provide a motive for having other-directed concern that is lacking in Slote’s view, and that is less otherworldly than the transcendent Good described by Murdoch.

However, the notion of aiming at “harmony” might seem at best naive or at worst an excuse for bland conformism. Angle addresses these challenges in the second section of Part II. In particular, Angle examines Martha Nussbaum’s suggestion that mature ethical perception involves the recognition of a plurality of competing values, as well as Diana Meyers’s challenge that “rancorous emotional attitudes” may be functional for perceiving and acting on injustices in the status quo. Angle responds with a nuanced account of some of the ways that Confucians have tried to find harmony in situations where values come into conflict. (For example, Confucians are keen on the ethical dilemmas created by sage-king Shun’s interactions with his vicious relatives.) In addition, he notes that Confucians mark a clear distinction between anger, which may be an appropriate response to wrongdoing, and ethically crippling “wrath”.

In the third section of Part II, Angle discusses the stages in ethical development that an individual goes through on the road to sagehood. According to the Neo-Confucians, we always have the ability to perceive the world in an unselfish, harmonious way. What we must develop is the commitment to use this ability. The sage is someone for whom this commitment has become second nature, so that she always perceives, and hence acts, appropriately.

Part III of the book turns in greater detail to the numerous techniques the Neo-Confucians identified as tools for ethical cultivation. “Lesser Learning” was their term for the habituation of the young into good habits. (As Angle notes, this sounds very much like Aristotle.) When old enough, one enters the “Greater Learning”, “when we start to become conscious authors of our own cultivation” (141). Part of this Greater Learning is reading and discussing classic texts in a reflective manner, with an eye toward cultivating our own ethical insight so that it ultimately goes beyond the texts. (Those with a stereotypical image of Confucianism will be surprised at the extent to which actual Neo-Confucians challenged their students to think for themselves and critically evaluate what they read.) But at least as important to Greater Learning is approaching everything one does with “reverence”. I think Angle is correct in characterizing reverence as “attending single-mindedly to a particular thing or matter before one, in all of its distinctness, which will simultaneously include being aware of the interdependence of that thing or matter with its entire context” (154). (This is very similar to what Buddhists describe as “mindfulness”.)

The last sections of Part III turn to the political implications of Neo-Confucianism. A common objection to Confucianism is that the ideal of sagehood is deeply connected with an unrealistic utopianism that is inimical to democracy and easily leads to absolutism. Emperor Ming Taizu seems to provide a disastrous example of a ruler whose (apparently sincere) commitment to Confucianism became the rationalization for atrocities (188-90). Angle’s response is characteristically nuanced. He notes that, historically, Confucians have not advocated blind loyalty. In addition, Angle sketches a Confucian argument in favor of participatory democracy, synthesizing a number of sources (including major twentieth-century Confucians whose work is not yet available in translation). Angle argues that the most plausible form of democracy for Confucians will include a “moderate perfectionism” (which advocates the noncoercive teaching of non-sectarian values).

Throughout the book, Angle makes good use of recent empirical studies. For example, Martin Hoffman’s Empathy and Moral Development (Cambridge, 2000) presents psychological evidence for a model of ethical growth that parallels that recommended by Neo-Confucians (138-39). In addition, several narrative accounts of contemporary ethically committed lives, including Anne Colby and William Damon’s Some Do Care: Contemporary Lives of Moral Commitment (The Free Press, 1992), support and illustrate Neo-Confucian views on character traits that lead to social-mindedness (162 ff.).

Angle’s book opens up many possibilities for dialogue and productive disagreement. I’ll mention just one issue here. “Li” is a central Neo-Confucian term discussed by Angle in Part I of his book. I have two disagreements with him, one about how best to render “li” into English, and the other a more substantive (but subtle) disagreement over how li fits into Neo-Confucian metaphysics. Angle helpfully explains the intuition behind the Neo-Confucian view:

it is apparent that we do experience order, patterns, and intelligibility in our world… . Our perceptions of things or events or reactions are inevitably patterned, coherent, and conceptualized… . What do our patterned perceptions have in common? (32, emphasis mine)

The Neo-Confucian answer is that they have li in common. Readers with an Aristotelian background might be tempted to render “li” as “form”. However, as Angle notes, li is not an individuated property or quality, such as redness or triangularity. Rather, li is "a kind of pattern or network of interdependencies" (35, emphasis mine). It is certainly convenient and legitimate to talk about the li of individual things: "That a boat can move on water and not on land, for instance, is an intelligible and valuable pattern" (43, emphasis mine). But these li are only aspects of larger patterns of relationships. "The [li] of the boat is not just the way its pieces (keel, oars, etc.) fit together, but also the way that the whole boat fits together with an environment" (35). As the seminal Neo-Confucian philosopher Zhu Xi explains, the complete set of all interrelationships is called the “Way”: “‘Way’ is the overall term; ‘li’ is the detailed articulations.”1 Elsewhere, Zhu Xi explains, "It’s like this plank of wood. There is just the one Way of its li, but this grain goes this way and that grain goes that way."2 So far, Angle and I are in complete agreement. However, the reader can be forgiven some surprise when, after all his own uses of the term “pattern”, Angle concludes that it is a mistake to translate “li” using this word. Instead, he suggests that we render it “coherence”. But this results in translations that are awkward and unintuitive. We can grasp fairly easily what Zhu Xi means by the pattern made by the grain in wood. But what are we to make of the notion of the coherence of a piece of wood?

The other issue is what to make of the Neo-Confucian claim that there is ultimately only one pattern, which is fully present in each and every thing that exists. Angle’s position, if I understand it correctly, is that there are multiple patterns (li) of relations among the things that exist. (For example, the relationship I have with my children is one pattern, and the relationship between my college’s president and the school’s students is another pattern.) However, these patterns are interlocking, so that no characterization of any one pattern would be fully accurate without referring to every other pattern. (My relationship with my children influences my relationship with my students, which influences my relationship with my school’s administration, and so on.) So there is a metaphorical sense in which the complete set of patterns is fully present in, for example, any one of my students. There is an alternative understanding of Neo-Confucian metaphysics that is more literal, though. On this view, there is one pattern, but this same pattern manifests itself in a variety of different ways, depending upon context. For example, benevolence is part of the pattern, and it manifests itself in different but related ways in a good father’s treatment of his children, a good teacher’s treatment of his students, and a good administrator’s treatment of her faculty. This second interpretation seems to do a better job of handling certain passages, such as Zhu Xi’s claim that, because the pattern is present in every thing, benevolence and righteousness are manifest even in a writing brush.3

Although I have ended on a subtle disagreement with Angle over the details of Neo-Confucian metaphysics, I want to stress again that his book is very accessible for readers with a wide variety of backgrounds. Philosophers with no background in Chinese thought will find challenging and interesting discussions of many issues relevant to their own work. Furthermore, I think this book is also quite appropriate to assign to strong undergraduate students. I recommend it highly.

1 Zhu Xi, Zhuzi yulei (Zhonghua shuju ed.), 99:2.

2 Zhu Xi, Zhuzi yulei (Zhonghua shuju ed.), 102:8.

3 Zhu Xi, Zhuzi yulei (Zhonghua shuju ed.), 61:12-13. For more on this interpretation, see Bryan W. Van Norden, “What Is Living and What Is Dead in the Philosophy of Zhu Xi?” in Robin R. Wang, ed., Chinese Philosophy in an Era of Globalization (SUNY Press, 2004), pp. 99-120.