Sartre and the Moral Limits of War and Terrorism

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Jennifer Ang Mei Sze, Sartre and the Moral Limits of War and Terrorism, Routledge, 2010, 236 pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415871402.

Reviewed by Matthew Eshleman, University of North Carolina at Wilmington



Jennifer Ang Mei Sze’s Sartre and the Moral Limits of War and Terrorism provides an ambitious study of Jean-Paul Sartre’s widely varying analyses of violence. Traversing his massive corpus, Sze both “reconstructs” (2, 3, 4, 7, 132) and “reinterprets” (4, 7, 27, 107) her way to what she labels ‘the violent Sartre.’ This is a self-consciously ironic label, since the “reconstructed ‘violent Sartre’” takes an “absolutist” position that prohibits certain kinds of violence, “especially when terrorist tactics are involved” (2, 89, see also 132). Undoubtedly this book will stir controversy, especially given Sartre’s many incendiary remarks about violence, which do not appear (at all) to caution against terrorist tactics and/or the killing of civilians, at least not at first glance; e.g., those from his preface to Fanon’s The Wretched of the Earth 1961 and later from essays in the Maoist revolutionary newspaper La Cause du peuple [early 1970’s].1 While Sze offers reasonable interpretations of these polemical essays, which render them consistent with her reconstructed view, her relative strengths and least controversial analyses occur when she focuses on Sartre’s theoretical works, which provide this book’s central focus.

There Sze characterizes a “more moderate” Sartre who focused on subhuman situations permeated by inescapable violence. In these kinds of “impossible” situations, inaction (and or non-violent resistance) necessarily perpetuates already existing violence. Thus, for Sartre, at least in his more sober moments, the central questions about violence do not concern whether to employ violence; rather they regard distinguishing between different kinds of violence and showing which ones are morally excusable. Two provocative theses, then, capture the crux of Sze’s reconstructed view, here merely stated and elaborated below. First, while violence cannot be morally justified, it can be morally excused (a claim later qualified). Second, in order for violence to be morally excused, it must meet certain conditions, operate within specified limitations, and be directed towards specifically humanizing ends. On the basis of the reconstructed view, Sze develops a Sartrean analysis of the terrorist attacks of September 11th (showing why Sartre would have opposed them), offers a critique of the Bush administration’s response, and, if this were not already enough, sketches an “ethics of action and self-commitment” as something of an antidote to U.S. foreign policy. She delivers all of this in a very densely packed 184 pages.

This tremendous undertaking, painstaking and punctuated with illuminating moments, makes several important gestures that will be of interest primarily to Sartre scholars. Sze develops a strong, albeit uneven and not fully substantiated case for a basic theoretical continuity across Sartre’s corpus. She successfully shows that Sartre’s analysis of conflict in Being and Nothingness should not, contrary to prevailing winds, be equated with hostility, although with some vagueness in terms of how hostility relates to violence. Most importantly, she sheds some clarity on, for lack of better words, features of Sartre’s normative epistemology. However, while much can be said for this study, it also suffers various shortcomings that interfere with appreciating its virtues. These range from stylistic and organizational matters, including but not limited to awkward linguistic constructions, repetition, a pell-mell development of central arguments, and misleading citations to more substantive problems.2 Sze develops rather flatfooted treatments of a narrow range of secondary literature (exclusively written in or translated into English); largely fails to treat Sartre’s view developmentally (at least in the first half of the book, notwithstanding a few remarks made during the introduction); builds central features of her main argument on secondhand accounts of unpublished texts; and she writes in such a way that makes it difficult to tell when she is interpreting as opposed to reconstructing a text. Given the very large amount of material Sze covers, this review cannot offer a (chapter by chapter) synopsis of the book but rather elaborates upon a few of these shortcomings, while addressing the book’s strengths.

That Sze offers both a reconstruction and reinterpretation of Sartre’s corpus potentially mitigates the general failure to treat Sartre’s analyses of violence developmentally. While Sze never clearly spells out precisely what she means by “reconstruction,” she interprets and assembles texts in a way that makes Sartre’s various discussions of violence fit into one large coherent picture. The success of this project, however, requires making the acts of sanding and assembly more explicit than she does. For instance, Sze (more often in the first half of the book) rapidly shifts her discussion between texts published years apart, often within a single paragraph or page, sometimes without indicating that a series of quotes come from different texts (see for example 16-17, 21, 66-67, 109), and often without explicit mention of the at least potentially serious problems involved in wedding (at least apparently) disparate texts.

To be sure, the ease with which Sze weaves together large swaths of Sartre’s corpus cuts two ways. One can describe her first chapter on Sartre’s theoretical framework as a powerful synthetic vision that reconstructs the methods (but not the theories) of Being and Nothingness (BN), The Notebooks for an Ethics (NE), and The Critique of Dialectical Reason (CDR) into a single “unified enterprise” (28). Or, one can view it as something of a pastiche that, at the very least, fails to appreciate many subtleties and nuances both within single texts and across Sartre’s corpus as a whole. Both descriptions are in some sense apt. On the one hand, Sze has a strong grasp of a considerable amount of material. The first chapter begins a compelling case for a basic methodological unity between Sartre’s early (BN), transitional middle (NE) and late (CDR) periods, which is strengthened in the second chapter and over the course of the book. On the other hand, Sze does not, at least initially or with much concentration, address how these texts change and differ from one another or what the commonly perceived problems are in terms of arguing for continuity, to say nothing of a unified enterprise. Thus, while Sze manages to digest a great deal of textual material, her discussion comes across as somewhat monochromatic.3

Sze’s analyses of questions about the justification of violence provide (in my opinion) the most interesting but also the most puzzling parts of her book. As noted above, she opens her book with the provocative thesis that while violence cannot be morally justified, some instances can be morally excused (2). In Chapter 5, Sze elaborates on this thesis when she distinguishes between claims about violence and uses of violence (111-113). She argues that whereas claims about violence can be morally justified, uses of violence cannot (111). Although Sze does not put matters quite this way, the gist of her discussion is as follows: in order for reasons (that support claims about violence) to be good they must establish at least two necessary conditions: first, a situation must be sufficiently bad (dehumanizing, rights destroying, etc.), and, second, no means other than violence can rectify it (establish rights and the possibility of integral humanity) (113). If good reasons can be established, then an oppressed group makes a legitimate claim about violence, presumably as a means towards liberation.

When it comes to explaining why uses of violence cannot be morally justified but only morally excused, Sze’s discussion is rather thin. She mentions, in passing, that the use of violence is unjustifiable, because it is “morally undesirable” (111). The only proximal explanation she gives for this claim is that regardless of whether violence is oppressive or liberatory “violence can only bring destruction” (114).4 There are a couple of separate but related worries worth raising here. First, Sze gives very little detail at this crucial juncture of her argument. Even if we cannot normatively distinguish between different kinds of uses of violence in terms of their destructive function, this does not seem like the only way to make such a distinction. When pressed, Sze seems to want to maintain that we can only be justified in our claims about violence but never in our claims about kinds of uses. Hence, it is difficult to see why the original distinction is not merely semantic. Second, consequently, it is unclear what work this distinction (between claims about and uses of) does. It not only deflates her initial thesis that all violence is morally unjustified, but it remains unclear why this approach does not introduce a surreptitious justification of uses of violence. Sze might reply that even if a liberation movement is justified in its claims about violence, not all uses of violence are excusable. Fair enough, but it is hard to see how the conditions that distinguish excused from unexcused kinds of uses of violence will not introduce a justificatory warrant, a point developed below. Third, it is frequently difficult to map Sze’s discussion onto what Sartre actually says. I am unaware of any text where Sartre explicitly distinguishes between ‘claims about’ and ‘uses of’ violence. Nor am I aware of any text where he straightforwardly argues that uses of violence cannot be justified.5

This last point raises a general worry that hampers much of her book. Otherwise put, it is often unclear where Sze interprets Sartre’s texts and where she reconstructs them. To take one example central to the main argument of her book, according to Sze, Sartre “demonstrated the limitations of revolutions in terms of target and the scope of destruction” (78) and she argues that Sartre considered violent attacks on non-military targets inexcusable (78, see also 121). She refers to two texts in evidence of this claim: Sartre’s essay on Cuba, “Ideology and Revolution,” (78) and Sartre’s unpublished lecture notes, known as the Rome Lectures (121). However, Sze offers no quoted material (from either source) that straightforwardly, explicitly, and or unambiguously establishes that for Sartre excusable violence must be limited to military targets.6 To be sure, her discussion is suggestive and well taken; however, it is difficult to tease out the precise scope of limits and the nature of targets, especially given Sartre’s abstract language and apparent omissions. For instance, while the Rome Lectures address limitations to violence and, hence, what Sze might call the conditions for its excuse, nowhere according to Thomas Anderson do the Rome Lectures explicitly address the distinction between military and civilian targets.7

To complicate matters, Sze does not seem to have actually read the unpublished notes. (For full disclosure, I have not). Consequently, she relies on several secondhand sources and her analysis does not seem to me to extend much beyond what already exists in print. To further confuse matters, when she quotes from these lecture notes, she shifts between secondhand sources without warning, and sometimes without clearly indicating whether the quoted material comes originally from Sartre’s notes or from a commentator’s interpretation of those notes, see for instance pp. 117, 120-121. Needless to say, this makes it difficult to follow, much less evaluate Sze’s exegesis on this matter. Ironically, a great deal of her discussion of the Rome Lectures notes, which provide a crucial piece of evidence for her central argument, comes directly from Ronald Santoni’s exemplary book Sartre on Violence: Curiously Ambivalent (SV).8 The irony results from Sze attributing to Santoni “the militant interpretation” (123) or what she elsewhere labels his “terrorist interpretation” (5), which apparently fails to ascribe to Sartre any limits to the use of violence whatsoever. To be sure, Santoni does think that Sartre overreaches, but specifically in certain texts, primarily Sartre’s preface to Fanon’s Wretched of the Earth. For this reason, amongst others, Santoni does not find Sartre entirely consistent in his writings on violence and neither does anyone else I have read. To which it might be added, whatever else one may think of Santoni’s personal position on violence as a life-long pacifist and opponent of nuclear proliferation, and even if one disagrees with his thoughtful criticisms of Sartre, Sze’s many snips at Santoni’s heels are generally either misleading or false.

With that said, Santoni self-avowedly “leans on” Robert Stone’s and Betsy Bowman’s early groundbreaking work during his discussion of four considerations from the Rome Lectures notes that require limiting violence (SV: 149-50). Anderson enumerates seven, though in less detail.9 The following paraphrases Santoni’s list, which Sze more or less repeats. Violence (1) is permissible only if does not bring about further oppressive and or alienating conditions. (2) Violence must preclude all ideologies of Terror. (3) Violence can provide no justification other than its necessity.10 And (4) Terror must find its origins in the masses and be taken up by the leaders in turn. Sze places considerable expository weight on (2) as requiring that violence limit itself “to the source that created the subhuman situation” and that excessive violence undermines the “synthetic whole” of the project of liberation (121). Technically speaking, nothing here rules out targeting civilians. Perhaps, Sze would grant this and note that if civilians were established as the source of a subhuman situation, then they would be fair targets. It is difficult to say, given Sze’s discussion and the same can be said for Sartre, a point that returns shortly.

Sze’s reading of (3) is puzzling. She interprets it as follows: “Violence is permissible if there are no other responses except to submit to the subhuman situation” (121-22). There are two unclear matters here. First, Sze does not employ her original distinction between claims about and uses of violence and she makes it sound like violence simpliciter. Second, whether Sze takes “permissible” to be equivalent to “justified” is unclear. For sometimes when she uses “permissible” it sounds closer to “excused.” Per her earlier discussion, one would expect her to say that claims about violence (on grounds of impossibility) are justified but uses can only be excused, if they meet certain conditions. Whatever the case may be, while it does seem plausible to read Sartre as saying here that the only justification of violence can be because it is sometimes necessary to liberate severely oppressed peoples, it remains unclear why uses of violence would not be justified on these grounds, to say nothing of whether Sartre here means moral justification or some other kind of justification. And it would be helpful were Sze to elaborate at greater length and with more clarity upon why what Sartre says (here and in other places) does not constitute moral justification for the uses of violence, why one can only morally excuse uses of violence, what the difference is between excuse and justification, and why the distinction is important.

There seem to me two basic problems here. On the one hand, Sze might want to say that the conditions of excuse somehow stand outside of and above moral considerations. Outside, since they are not moral in nature, and above, since they take precedence over moral undesirability. But in this case, why call such cases morally excusable uses of violence, since the excuses would stand on some non-moral but unidentified grounds? On the other hand, more problematically, if the excuses of the uses of violence are moral, as Sze earlier claims, then it is unclear how this distinction really amounts to anything more than pure semantics. Does not morally excusing uses of violence morally justify it?

However the theoretical dust settles, Sartre’s discussion reaches such heights of abstraction that three additional worries should be mentioned. First, it renders him open to misinterpretation. Second, the textual evidence does not support any uncontroversial interpretation, even though the text rules out some interpretations as clearly mistaken. Third, building upon a worry mentioned by Robert Stone and Betsy Bowman, because Sartre is “disappointingly abstract,” given the gravity of these issues such abstract language is not merely disappointing but extremely dangerous, a matter Sze would do well to take more seriously.11 It is very difficult to illuminate the precise nature of the limits and targets of what Sartre takes to be acceptable uses of violence, to say nothing of determining what actual situations would meet the conditions of acceptability. In my view, the gravity of the issue of violence obligates theoreticians to higher standards of clarity than usual and Sze oversteps when she introduces her study with the audacious claim that “Sartre’s position on violence has been consistently clear” (2). To be sure, she cautiously seems to change her appraisal later in her study when she claims that Sartre “”“>may not have been clear at times” (113, emphasis added). May?

In an interview from 1960, Sartre explains:

When I entered the Ecole Normale, no one … would have dared to say that one should refuse violence. Our concern was principally to channel it, to limit it. A well behaved violence, and profitable. We were for the most part very mild, and yet we had become creatures of violence because one of our problems was to know whether a given action was an act of revolutionary violence or whether it went beyond justifiable revolutionary violence. The problem remained with us. We shall never solve it.12

I leave it up to commentators to determine whether Sartre here projects his contemporary thoughts on violence back thirty years and also how to weigh the last sentence. My point is that Sze captures the spirit of Sartre’s thinking on violence in the 1960’s and 1970’s. However, while I am in full sympathy with the spirit of her project, Sartre and the Moral Limits of War and Terrorism reads unevenly and one has to work hard to dig out its insights. In the end, Sze shows tremendous potential and covers an extraordinary amount of material. On the basis of this study of violence, one would reasonably expect her to produce an exceptional work in the future.

1 To take but one well known example from the former: “to shoot down a European is to kill two birds with one stone, to destroy an oppressor and the man he oppresses at the same time: there remains a dead man and a free man.” Quote taken from the original Grove Press edition, 1963, p. 22.

2 Here are a few examples of misleading citations. Sze criticizes a claim made by Mary Warnock (21) but never directly references any of Warnock’s work; the footnote at the end of her rebuttal refers to Thomas Anderson’s work (189). This might seem trivial, except that Sze has something of a habit of making claims about texts when it is unclear that she has actually read them firsthand. For instance, when Sze discusses Sartre’s early essay “Materialism and Revolution” 1946 (109-10), all of her quotes come from Ronald Santoni’s Sartre on Violence. Worse, Sze grounds much of her case that Sartre argues for limitations to violence on his unpublished notes referred to as the Rome Lectures. Not only does it appear that Sze has not read the notes, and I have not; she cites various different secondhand sources, shifting between them without any indication in the text: sometimes her quotes are from Sartre, sometimes they are secondhand commentary, or based upon secondhand commentary, (it is difficult to tell), see especially pp. (120-23). In a similar vein, Sze references Wikipedia pages, where it would have made sense to refer to official government documents, e.g., the National Security Strategy, during her discussion of the second Bush administration’s doctrine of preemption (123). She sometimes cites quotes without specific page references; see for example her references in Chapters four and five to the New Orleans Session on the terrorist attacks on 9-11 at the North American Sartre Society meeting in March, 2002, and published in Sartre Studies International, 9:2, (December: 2003), pp. 9-25.

3 To be clear, this objection is not to the spirit of Sze’s analysis but to its letter, since, in my opinion, Sartre’s major theoretical works are, at least, thinly continuous. However, a persuasive case for a unified enterprise requires more attention to the marked and well-known tensions and discontinuities between the different developmental stages than Sze provides.

4 Sze also discusses the relationship between the destructive nature of violence and justification on p. 119. There she repeats the claim that uses of violence cannot be morally good because they are destructive, referring to p. 404 of the Notebooks for an Ethics in support of this claim. There Sartre depicts the violence of revolt as ambiguous: “Revolt is both the assumption of Evil and the destruction of Evil” (NE: 404). Whatever the case may be, Sze flattens Sartre’s complicated analysis when she claim straightforwardly, “Sartre deemed that the act of violence in all projects of violence (antagonistic or revolutionary) entails the destruction of the other and therefore cannot be morally good” (119).

5 A qualification is in order. In Sartre’s posthumously published Notebooks for an Ethics violence has a paradoxical air about it. When Sartre employs the word “justification” he is almost always talking about false rationalizations of violence. But to show that many justifications of the use of violence are in bad faith does not explain why all justifications must be in bad faith. When Sartre speaks about a slave revolting, he says, “let us try to understand it in its ambiguity and to legitimate violence” (NE: 398). It is difficult to tell whether and to what extent Sartre uses these words “justified” and “legitimate” differently. Sze herself is not entirely clear and sometimes shifts between uses of “legitimate” and “justified” in her discussion, see especially 111-114.

6 Sze also makes a parallel when she addresses Sartre’s controversial essay in La Cause du peuple — J’accuse, No. 29, du 15, Oct. 1972, where he discusses the events of the Munich summer Olympic games (101-103). Palestinians attacked Israelis in their quarters, killing two Israeli athletes, and taking other athletes and coaches hostage. Their aim was to negotiate a hostage exchange with the Israeli government. Sze argues that Sartre saw the Palestinian cause as legitimate but condemned their terrorist tactics of killing innocent athletes (101-103). In this way, she reads this essay as showing how Sartre saw the Palestinians as having a legitimate claim to using violence but employing an inexcusable form. Sartre’s discussion in this essay is ambiguous and can be read in different ways. However one reads it, these ambiguities should be mentioned. A translation of this essay by Betsy Bowman has been published in Sartre Studies International, 9:2, (2003).

8 (University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2003.

9 Op. cit. pp. 127-28.

10 Sze renders (3) like this: “Third, violence is permitted ’[o]nly if no [reason] of Terror is offered other than its ”“>necessity’” (121). Sze omits the word “justification” and replaces it with “reason.” Here is the French ala Santoni: "sans autre justification que sa nécessité" (SV: 150).

11 See their essay, “Dialectical Ethics: A First Look at Sartre’s Unpublished 1964 Rome Lecture Notes,” Social Text, 13:14, (1986), p. 211.

12 Emphasis added. I draw this quote from Oreste Pucciani’s “Sartre and Flaubert as Dialectic”, The Philosophy of Jean-Paul Sartre, ed. P. A. Schilpp, (La Salle: Open Court, 1981), p. 499. The original text of the conversation with Madeline Chapsal can be found in her Les Ecrivains en personne, (Paris: René Julliard, 1960), p. 223.