Sartre, Foucault and Historical Reason, Volume 2: A Poststructuralist Mapping of History

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Thomas Flynn, Sartre, Foucault and Historical Reason, Volume 2: A Poststructuralist Mapping of History, University of Chicago Press, 2005, 390 pp, $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 0226254712.

Reviewed by Amy Allen, Dartmouth College


Without doubt, Jean-Paul Sartre and Michel Foucault are two of the most important figures in twentieth century French philosophy, each a leading representative -- if not the leading representative -- of his generation of French intellectuals. Although they occasionally made common cause politically, they were, at least at first glance, philosophical opposites; after all, Foucault made his mark in philosophy by attacking both the meaning-constituting transcendental-phenomenological subject and the humanism that were the touchstones of Sartrean existentialism. And yet, as Thomas Flynn's impressive two-volume comparative study of Sartre and Foucault makes clear, these thinkers have much more in common that has been supposed up to now. To take just one example, Flynn makes a compelling case for the similarities between the Sartrean conception of committed history -- an analogue to committed literature -- and Foucault's notion of critical and effective history, articulated in his early essay "Nietzsche, Genealogy, History." As Flynn tells the story, both Sartre and Foucault evince a "shared concern with the ethical dimension of this seemingly epistemic undertaking that is the philosophy of history" (Flynn, 2: 284).

Flynn is, however, careful to point out that his aim is neither to reduce one of these philosophers to the framework of the other -- as he puts it, "it is not my intent to create a postmodern Sartre, much less a modern Foucault" (Flynn, 1: x) -- nor is it to cobble together a facile Sartre-Foucault synthesis. Instead, as he explains at the close of volume 2, his goal is simply to read the two philosophers in relation to one another -- particularly with reference to their understandings of history -- in order to be enriched by them. There is no doubt that Flynn accomplishes this somewhat too modest statement of his goal. Each of these volumes offers a rich, nuanced, complex and comprehensive account of its subject, and together the two volumes offer original, sometimes surprising, insights into the continuities and discontinuities between these two philosophers and into the strengths and limitations of their respective philosophical approaches. A careful examination of the intellectual relationship between Sartre and Foucault is long overdue, and Flynn's study marks a major contribution to this important philosophical project.

Moreover, volume 2, which is the focus of this review, stands alone as a significant contribution to Foucault scholarship. Flynn's overall goal for volume 2 is a "rational reconstruction of the philosophical histories that Foucault left us" in order to "search for the elements of a 'theory' of history in the writings of this avowed antitheoretician" (Flynn, 2: ix). In the service of this reconstructive project, Flynn offers an ingenious proposal for reading Foucault's oeuvre, while admitting that his desire to find continuity in Foucault's diverse projects is something of an anti-Foucaultian impulse. (As this is an impulse that Foucault himself often seemed to share, it is easy to forgive Flynn for it). Flynn's inspiration for his continuity thesis is the observation that what is "characteristically postmodern" about Foucault's approach to historical reason is "his emphasis on space over time both in the metaphors he employs and especially in the arguments he mounts" (Flynn, 2: xii). The importance of spatiality in Foucault's thought leads Flynn to propose what he calls an "axial" interpretation of his work as a whole. The starting point for this interpretation is Foucault's late characterization of his work as running along three axes: "knowledge-truth, power-governmentality, and subjectification-ethics" (Flynn, 2: 332-333, note 37). Although Foucault foregrounds a different axis at each stage of his career -- the knowledge-truth axis during the archaeological period, the power-governmentality axis during the genealogical, and the subjectification-ethics axis during the final, which Flynn characterizes as the problematizing, period -- each of Foucault's major works can be read (or, as Flynn says, charted) along all three axes. The implications of this highly provocative interpretive proposal will be discussed below.

Part I sets the stage for the axial reading by exploring two concepts that are central to Foucault's thinking of history: nominalism and the event. After sketching Foucault's intellectual relationship to the Annalistes in the first chapter, Flynn devotes a chapter each to these two "conceptual coordinates" for mapping Foucault's work (Flynn, 2: 16). The task of a nominalist history -- a history that holds "that only individuals exist, that general terms and concepts are mere 'words'" (Flynn, 2: 31) -- is "to lay bare … practices in their plurality and their contingency in order to reveal the fields that make an otherwise heterogeneous collection of objects and events intelligible" (Flynn, 2: 34). Ironically, Flynn suggests, this commitment to nominalism is not only one of the main lines of continuity in Foucault's thought, it is also a "functional equivalent to that historical unity which Sartre sought in dialectical reason" (Flynn, 2: 32). As for the concept of the event, Flynn argues that its importance in Foucault's early work problematizes his relationship to structuralism and thus provides a counter to the charge that Foucaultian archaeology is anti-history. With this concept, Foucault introduces the elements of chance, discontinuity, and contingency into historiography. However much Foucault's methodology and his criticisms of traditional history and its emphasis on battles and treaties links him to the new historians, his emphasis on the event provides a bridge between him and the old (see Flynn, 2: 80).

Part II opens with a discussion of the role of vision and visual metaphors in Foucault's work. Flynn focuses on the diacritical nature of Foucaultian methodology to reconcile the apparent tension between his simultaneous critique and employment of visual metaphors, and he introduces the kaleidoscope as an apt metaphor for this diacritical method: "Foucault is a philosopher of the 'miniscule … displacement'. He turns (often reverses) the kaleidoscope of our received views to produce new, frequently liberating perspectives" (Flynn, 2: 97, quoting Foucault, The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences (New York: Vintage, 1970) 238). Chapter 5 focuses on the importance of spatiality to Foucault's thought. Although Flynn emphasizes that Foucault does not neglect time -- as he puts it, "one could scarcely write history without it'' (Flynn, 2: 95) -- he also argues that "it is in 'spatialized' language that Foucault seeks liberation, not only from the suzerainty of a homogeneous and universal time and the phenomenology, whether pure or hermeneutical, that is its interpretant, but from the metaphor of depth …" (Flynn, 2: 105). Moreover, Flynn insists that the spatial is not just a metaphor in Foucault's work, it is a technique that is "integral to his argumentation" (Flynn, 2: 110). This leads to a characterization, in chapter 6, of Foucault's project as a mapping -- as opposed to a narrative -- of history, a cartographical project that aims to "render history intelligible without appeal to traditional concepts of evolution, development, or even influence" (Flynn, 2: 130). The conclusion to Part II, and the apex of the book, is an extended discussion of Flynn's axial reading of Foucault's oeuvre. This interpretation, which Flynn demonstrates with a fascinating and plausible axial reading of Madness and Civilization, leads to some surprising results; perhaps the most surprising, particularly to Foucault's critics, will be Flynn's claim that Foucault's early, archaeological work can be read along the axis of subjectivation because "the subject was never banished, though the Cartesian Subject in company with the transcendental Ego had left the French scene long before Foucault appeared" (Flynn, 2: 152-153). More about this issue in a moment.

In Part III, Flynn stages his final encounter between Sartre and Foucault. Chapter 8 reads Sartre in terms of this Foucaultian mapping of history, and poses the question: "is Foucault justified in labeling Sartre a man of the nineteenth century trying to think the twentieth?" (Flynn 2: 178). In response to this question, Flynn argues that "Sartrean existentialism, despite its supposed immersion in the modern episteme, is only imperfectly capable of being circumscribed by the anthropological quadrilateral or of being plotted along an archaeological axis" (Flynn 2: 194); however, this is at least in part because it contains some pre-modern (i.e., pre-Kantian) elements, such as Sartre's commmitment to realism. (Does this mean Sartre is actually a man of the seventeeth century? Flynn doesn't say). The central chapters of Part III reveal some of the often unnoticed existentialist features of Foucault's work -- chapter 9 focuses on the role of experience, which comes to the fore in Foucault's late work but is, according to Flynn, a recurrent theme from Madness and Civilization forward; chapter 10 compares his analysis of power with Sartre's account of violence and uncovers similarities in their accounts of freedom; and chapter 11 notes some interesting similarities between Foucaultian parrhesia and Sartrean authenticity -- although Flynn remains true to his intention of not reading either one of these thinkers in terms of the other. As he cautions the reader: even "as existentialist features have begun to emerge along Foucault's axis of subjectivation, one should not rush to detect a 'return of the repressed' in his later work" (Flynn, 2: 281). Significant and arguably intractable differences between the two thinkers remain, as Flynn makes clear in his concluding chapter (see Flynn 2: 287-290). Sartre is, after all, an ontologist, while Foucault is a nominalist. Sartre's commitment to dialectical reason -- a commitment grounded in his privileging of the temporal -- is difficult to square with Foucault's account of multiple rationalities -- a commitment grounded in his privileging of spatiality. Finally, although there is doubtless an ethical dimension to the work of both Sartre and Foucault, such a dimension is much less problematic for Sartre, who is a straightforward moralist, than it is for Foucault, who is at best a reluctant one.

Which leads me to my major concern with Flynn's reading of Foucault. Although I find his axial reading of Foucault for the most part compelling, it also raises some deep and difficult issues that Flynn does not satisfactorily resolve. On the one hand, according to the axial reading, subjectification-ethics is just one axis along which history can be charted, but it is not necessarily the privileged perspective from which the data of history should be viewed. As Flynn admits, "if one reads Foucault along the axis of subjectivation, it seems to leave the ethical a mere option among ways of describing a situation without granting it the kind of primacy that Sartre maintains or the overriding character that many, perhaps most, ethicists would accord it" (Flynn, 2: 289-90). On the other hand, Flynn characterizes Foucault as a deeply ethical thinker; he claims that Foucaultian "effective history is ethical and political to the core" (Flynn, 2: 291). Setting aside the deep and difficult issue of how Foucault's ethical commitments are to be grounded, especially in light of his persistent critique of reason (an issue that Flynn unfortunately sidesteps), the question for Flynn is this: is the ethical simply one of three axes along which Foucault's thought can be charted, or it is his abiding concern? Here Flynn seems to waffle. As he rightly points out, from the very beginning, Foucault's history of reason "is motivated by the desire to uncover those lines of legitimization and hypothetical necessity that control human behavior in ways that we find intolerable" (Flynn, 2: 296), but the problem is that to the extent that this ethical-political concern is understood as a constant throughout Foucault's work, Flynn's axial reading comes to seem less plausible. In fact, insofar as the ethical dimension of Foucault's thought is primary, it would seem that his late account of ethical subjectivation is really the key to understanding his thought as a whole, but this pushes us in the direction not of an axial reading but of some kind of developmental one.

To his credit, Flynn acknowledges this possibility, but at this point he pulls his punch, claiming that his axial reading should at least be considered "a complement, if not an alternative, to the evolutionary model" and one that "is productive of new insights and attention to overlooked issues" (Flynn, 2: 303). I don't disagree, but was hoping for a stronger argument against the kind of developmental reading that would see the ethics-subjectivation axis as the culmination of Foucault's philosophical trajectory. The flip side of this worry is that Flynn does not do enough to argue against a third interpretive possibility that some have marshalled to explain Foucault's late work: the negative-developmental, death-bed confession interpretation that is favored by critics of Foucault such as Habermas. To push the point for a minute, what critics such as Habermas suggest is that there is a basic incompatibility between the first two axes, which seem to undermine both subjectivity and ethics, and the third, which relies on precisely these concepts. The careful distinctions that Flynn draws in chapter 7 between the subject, individual, and self are helpful here, inasmuch as they make it clear that Foucault's early attack on the Cartesian and phenomenological subject and his middle-period genealogy of the disciplinary individual do not preclude his late focus on the self. But this does not, in my view, go quite far enough. For example, Flynn does not explain how the notion of reflective freedom or thought -- namely, the freedom or capacity to reflect on and critically evaluate our situation -- that is operative in the subjectification-ethics axis is compatible with the uncovering of the epistemic conditions that make thought possible that are the focus of the knowledge-truth axis. Flynn acknowledges this difficulty when he notes that Foucault's "later move toward a theory of ethical 'subjectivation'" is "more problematic or at least in need of reconciliation with archaeological 'systems'" (Flynn, 2: 188); he suggests that his axial reading helps to resolve this dilemma, but he never explains precisely how. Flynn does hint at the direction such a resolution would have to take when he notes that, for Foucault, in order for us to be able to critically reflect on some feature of our social reality, that feature must first have been rendered uncertain or unfamiliar by social, economic, or political processes (see Flynn, 2: 164). However, Flynn seems to fail to notice here, first, that Foucault has to say this in order for his later conception of critical thought not to stand in blatant contradiction to his archaeological method, and, second, that this qualification renders critical thought or reflective freedom significantly less free than it might seem at first glance. Not only that, but the axial reading also leaves the reader with a nagging question: is freedom, as Flynn sometimes suggests, the basic value that pervades Foucault's histories of the present (see Flynn, 2: 256), or is it simply a key aspect of one of three possible axes along which historical experience can be analyzed?

Despite these unresolved difficulties, Flynn has produced an extraordinarily impressive piece of work, the product of a lifetime of research, scholarship, and thought. At a time when the pressures of academic publishing are such that so many books are so hurriedly thrown together, it is a joy to read such a fully realized piece of work.