Sartre on Sin: Between Being and Nothingness

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Kate Kirkpatrick, Sartre on Sin: Between Being and Nothingness, Oxford University Press, 2018, 288 pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198811732.

Reviewed by Stephen Michelman, Wofford College


Kate Kirkpatrick's provocative interdisciplinary study argues that Sartre's conception of nothingness in Being and Nothingness (BN) can be fruitfully understood as an iteration of the Christian doctrine of original sin, "nothingness" being synonymous with sin and evil in the Augustinian tradition. Hence, Sartre in BN presents us with "a phenomenology of sin from a graceless position" (10). For readers used to understanding Sartre through the lens of German phenomenology, this will come as a surprise. However, the book should be welcomed by all readers as it breathes life into the field of Sartre studies, offering a fresh perspective from which to judge the magnum opus of French existentialism.

Kirkpatrick is not the first to address Sartre's relation to theology or to note similarities between Sartre's ideas in BN and the doctrine of original sin. Her forerunners include Merold Westphal's Suspicion and Faith: The Religious Uses of Modern Atheism (1998), Stephen Mulhall's Philosophical Myths of the Fall (2005), and several articles by John Gillespie published in Sartre Studies International. She is, however, the first to pursue the topic in depth. Kirkpatrick's earlier book, Sartre and Theology (2017), which examines Sartre's engagement with theology more broadly, could be a useful background resource for readers of this one.

The centerpiece and historical anchor of the argument is presented in Part II, Chapter 2, which traces the genealogy of Sartre's conception of nothingness to French theological debates of the 1600s. Here, in addition to lucid expositions of Augustine, Descartes, and Pascal, we are introduced to Cornelius Jansen and Jansenism, the Catholic mystic Pierre de Bérulle ("Descartes' spiritual director"), and François Fénelon, whose account of the elusiveness and insubstantiality of the self is uncannily similar to Sartre's.

The aim of this part of the book is to demonstrate that Sartre, despite his professed atheism later, was exposed to theological issues and ideas as part of his education, and that he continued to draw upon theological language and ideas in his writings through the period of BN. Kirkpatrick's contention is that Sartre's discourse of "nothingness," when placed in the proper historical context, can and should be understood in a theological register, and not (exclusively) in relation to Hegel or Heidegger.

In the Augustinian tradition, original sin is a product of human freedom: the free choice to turn away from God (Being) towards "nothingness." This occurred first when Adam and Eve chose not to obey God's command in the Garden of Eden; since then, all humans exist in a state of sin from the moment of conception. Nothingness is thus "an alias of sin and evil: for Augustine, it is 'falling away from essence and tending not to be.'" (25) Alternately, it is an "ontological depletion of the soul" and a "tendency to nihilate oneself" (inanescere in Augustine's Latin) (26).

Similarities with Sartre's view are indeed striking. Sartre's portrayal of the for-itself as "haunted by nothingness" in BN can be read as a kind of ontological "fallenness" akin to a state of sin. We correctly surmise that, on Kirkpatrick's reading, Sartre's anthropology will also be pessimistic about the human condition.

In fact, because for Sartre there is no path to salvation by grace, Sartre's universe is bleaker than that of Augustine and Jansenism. In both views "we frustrate our own perfection and are plagued by dissatisfaction" (25). However, in Sartre's view we are "perpetually haunted by nothingness and brought face to face with the unrealizability of our ideals" (204). Sartre's view of the human being is thus characterized as an "eschatology of damnation" (181). Hell, as it turns, out is not only other people, it is existence itself.

Kirkpatrick documents fascinating parallels between the language of BN and that of 17th-century French theology. One example concerns Pierre de Bérulle, credited by Kirkpatrick as the source of otherwise puzzling language in The Transcendence of the Ego, such as Sartre's references to "emanation," "creation ex nihilo, and "continuous creation" (34). This is the language of French mysticism, we are reminded, and these concepts were originally employed by Bérulle and other writers, including Descartes, in a theological context. Kirkpatrick maintains that Sartre preserves not only the original language, but also the original concepts. For both Sartre and the French mystical/spiritual tradition, the human being is understood as intrinsically conflicted: caught in an unresolvable tension "between being and nothingness."

For Bérulle, Kirkpatrick writes, "In each moment of his life, man is on the point of falling back into nothingness, but at the same moment the [divine] force of continuous creation keeps him from it" (33). For Sartre, too, to the extent we are free, we continually risk "falling back into nothingness" because consciousness exercises a constant negation of what is factically given. The crucial difference is that, for Sartre, there is no "cure" for our condition: no grace, salvation, or resolution to the continuous nihilation at the core of conscious human existence.

Augustian/Jansenist debates about sin, salvation, and free will continue to preoccupy French intellectuals for centuries. The next chapter identifies features of these debates that resurface in French literature in the 18th and 19th century. Kirkpatrick's research leads her to discuss writers with whom Sartre was familiar in his teens and 20s, including Racine, Voltaire, and Victor Hugo. The chapter concludes with a detailed discussion of the French reception of Kierkegaard in the late 1920s and 1930s, focusing on the two works most influential for Sartre, The Concept of Anxiety and The Sickness unto Death.

Early on, Kirkpatrick introduces several methodological distinctions important to her argument. One is the distinction between evidential atheism and an atheism of "suspicion." Sartre is an atheist of suspicion: he does not deny God's existence due to lack of evidence, out of skepticism, rather he questions people's motives for believing in God. As Merold Westphal puts it, "Skepticism seeks to overcome the opacity of facts, while suspicion seeks to uncover the duplicity of persons" (8). Sartre's atheism is also, unlike the clear-cut evidential variety, "ambiguous" in its "origins, nature, and duration" (9). As a case in point, Kirkpatrick cites a passage from Words, where Sartre, recalling his childhood, describes an atheist as "a man with a phobia about God who saw his absence everywhere and who could not open his mouth without saying his name: in short, a Gentleman with religious convictions" (8).

The ambiguity of Sartre's atheism is also apparent in his plays, many of which contain explicit religious themes and language. No Exit is set in hell, for example, and Lucifer and the Lord uses the word "sin" in eleven different senses (enumerated by Kirkpatrick on page 17). Kirkpatrick discusses Sartre's rarely-read first play, Bariona, at length in Chapter 7 (190-96). Written by Sartre and performed for the prisoners in a German prison camp in 1940, the play is a mythical retelling of the Christian Nativity story cleverly written to appeal to both "Christians and non-believers" in the camp. Kirkpatrick suggests a theological reading consistent with her pessimistic interpretation of Sartre's anthropology. The message of Bariona, the titular character, is, "the dignity of man is in his despair." (195)

Another distinction Kirkpatrick appeals to is between a "humanist" and "anti-humanist" Sartre. While tenable in some ways, the distinction is problematic in others and would benefit from a clearer defense. The anti-humanist Sartre comprises Sartre's writings through 1946, and that date marks the limit of Kirkpatrick's study. (Commentators generally agree that Sartre's heightened concern with ethics and social and political commitment beginning in the late-1940s represents a shift in priorities and, to a degree, in philosophical method and outlook. I assume 1946 is chosen as Kirkpatrick's cut-off date because that is the year of the publication of "Existentialism is a Humanism," when Sartre announced that existential freedom entails values of activism, human dignity, and recognition of the freedom of others. These values are alien to the universe of BN on Kirkpatrick's reading.)

The distinction between a humanist and anti-humanist Sartre is essential for Kirkpatrick's view, for crucial to her interpretation of BN is the claim that Sartre is indebted to the French tradition of Jansenist theology, which is inherently pessimistic. Thus, BN, too, must be consistently pessimistic in its depiction of human existence. Yet this chronology is problematic. For example, while "Existentialism is a Humanism" was originally given in the fall of 1945, Kirkpatrick makes ample use of "Cartesian Freedom," a text Sartre wrote in 1946, as evidence for an anti-humanist interpretation.

Each chapter in Part III (Chapters 4 to 7) is devoted to the textual and conceptual analysis of BN. Chapter 4 reinforces the claim that BN is "influenced by" theological conceptions of nothingness as original sin by offering a reading of Part I of BN, "The Problem of Nothingness." Kirkpatrick begins with an interesting observation about the "noetic effects of sin" that links Sartre to Descartes' Fourth Meditation. Descartes explains the human tendency to error because we are "as it were, an intermediary between God and nothingness, or between supreme being and non-being." In this passage -- perhaps Sartre's inspiration for the title of BN -- Descartes explains that human error is not due to God, but to a "privation" of the human being.

The chapter goes on to discuss the psychological and emotional effects of sin in Sartre's account: anxiety and bad faith. A passage cited from Sebastian Gardner resonates with Kirkpatrick's theological perspective:

Only a being which has itself been nihilated, Sartre argues, could itself have the power to nihilate. Human being is . . . a 'fallen,' negated form of being-in-itself -- it is as if it had once been a thing, but had now undergone a kind of metaphysical destruction, so that it now exists . . . as a kind of ghost or shadow, robbed of being. (99)

The next chapters in Part III discuss theological implications of Sartre's conceptions of contingency, facticity, being as "lack," shame and being-for-others. While they contain many insightful observations, these discussions are a bit too dependent on citations and paraphrases of other commentators, and Kirkpatrick's voice sometimes gets lost. Some ideas, like the notion of the "witness" in Sartre's writings (116-18), are quite suggestive and could benefit from longer treatment.

Chapter 7, on freedom, continues to build the case for Sartre's pessimism. Here we are reminded that, for Sartre, ultimately, freedom is not liberating, rather "freedom is a curse." The freedom (or nothingness) of consciousness divides us from ourselves: from coinciding with our past, our present self-appraisals, and goals we set for ourselves in the future. At every moment, on account of our freedom we recognize the contingency of our projects and must choose ourselves anew. Thus, "Sartre's for-itself feels forsaken and forlorn on account of its freedom" (172).

Ultimately this leads to what Kirkpatrick calls Sartre's "anti-theodicy": his rejection of the value and purpose of human freedom. Unlike Leibniz, for whom freedom is sufficient reason to justify evil, Sartrean freedom is the cause of much evil but of no good. Because human beings find no good use for freedom, cannot understand themselves in their insubstantiality, and cannot but objectify and be objectified by others, Sartre's position is "a realized eschatology of damnation" (181). Perpetually threatened by our own subjectivity, yearning for an unattainable unity and wholeness, we exist in an unresolvable tension "between being and nothingness."

The book concludes in Part IV with an exploration of the positive contributions of Sartre's anthropology for "contemporary hamartiology." As success is understood in relation to failure, Christian optimism may be better understood in relation to Sartre's pessimism. We start by understanding Sartre's negative vision as a "hermeneutics of despair" in which humans, divided and dissipated by their essential nothingness, are disconnected from self, God, and others. This negative vision of humanity can be instructive for theology in that it documents the lived reality of sin -- for example, our tendency to deceive ourselves, and to objectify others with an "unloving gaze." For Sartre, the essence of love "is the demand to be loved" (207) by another; thus, because it alienates my freedom in the other, love is to be refused. The refusal of love results from Sartre's insistence that we must refuse anything that comes "from without," whether from another person, society, or God. In contrast, the Christian view of the person can be understood as the need to accept love and forgiveness from others and from God.

I will conclude by briefly sketching a few criticisms. Kirkpatrick's position induces her to dismiss or downplay positive dimensions of Sartre's analysis. Such dimensions are, admittedly, hard to find; however, there are candidates for consideration. One is "authenticity." Following Heidegger, Sartre employs a concept of authenticity starting in the late 1930s. BN, however, relegates authenticity to a footnote.

Does a concept of authenticity have a place in Being and Nothingness? Kirkpatrick, tellingly, also relegates her discussion to a footnote (114, n.68), where she concludes it does not. This is too terse. The book would benefit from a more detailed discussion.

Another neglected issue concerns the positive connotations of nothingness in BN. Sartre accepts a basic tenet of existentialist phenomenology, that all things we can name "derive their origin from an act, an expectation, or a project of the human being" (BN 59). "Nihilation" and "negation" -- avatars of nothingness -- create our experience of absence, distance, change, ourselves, the past, the future. Nothingness is in a sense the creative principle of the world. This suggests an important disanalogy between Sartre's philosophy and theological usage, where "being" represents the positive pole of divine creativity and goodness and "nothingness" represents the negative (in the sense of harmful and less valuable) pole of evil and deficiency. Similarly, "being" for Sartre, as "being-in-itself," is worldless and static. Kirkpatrick's argument would be strengthened by addressing this issue directly.

In the end, however, these objections do not diminish the value and importance of Kirkpatrick's impressive and erudite study. Sartre scholars of all stripes will benefit greatly from reading this book and responding to the fresh perspective it opens up.