Sartre's Phenomenology

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David Reisman, Sartre's Phenomenology, Continuum, 2007, 150pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826487254.

Reviewed by Katherine Morris, Mansfield College, University of Oxford


This difficult, flawed, thought-provoking book comprises five chapters: 1. Sartre and Strawson. 2. Pre-reflective consciousness and the perceptive field. 3. Impure reflection and the constitution of the psyche. 4. The Look and the constitution of persons. 5. Bad faith. It seems to me helpful to see it as consisting of two overlapping books: the first, spanning Chapters 1-4, outlines what David Reisman takes to be Sartre's answers to two linked post-Strawsonian questions: how a conscious subject comes to apprehend a genuinely objective world, and how such a subject constitutes itself as a person, i.e. a psycho-physical object. (Anglo-American post-Strawsonians should however be warned that little beyond Chapter 1 of this book will be readily accessible to them; even advanced students of Sartre will have to work hard.) The second, occupying roughly Chapters 2-5, is a contribution to the literature on bad faith that treats in more than usual detail the notions of impure reflection and psychic objects and which highlights the role of the Look in bad faith. Reisman uses Transcendence of the Ego, trs. F. Williams and R. Kirkpatrick, Noonday Press: New York, 1957 (hereafter TE), and Being and Nothingness, tr. H.E. Barnes, Washington Square Press: New York, 1966 (hereafter BN).

I will comment on each of these enterprises, but begin by outlining Chapters 2 and 3 which constitute their shared background.

I: Background

In Chapter 2, Reisman takes us through Sartre's critiques of Husserl's understanding of intentionality. He then describes the perceptive-cum-instrumental field, with particular reference to négatités (absences, lacks, etc.) and temporality. It is in this section above all others where one might have expected to see an explicit thematization of Sartre's debt to the Gestalt psychologists -- as indeed the back cover appears to promise. Although Reisman does foreground some of Sartre's Gestalt-derived language (e.g., field, figure-ground), it is surprising to see no reference to Kurt Lewin's notion of hodological space (of which Sartre was of course fond), and his linked notion of valences: the properties of the world picked out by Sartre's characteristic future-referential gerundives (the glass is to-be-drunk-from, the nail to-be-hammered-in), as well as his négatités, are such hodological properties. This background could have helped to make the introduction of négatités and temporality seem less gratuitous and to ground Sartre's crucial claim that 'perception and action are indistinguishable' (BN 424).

Reisman then turns to the distinction between pre-reflective (he clearly means non-positional) self-consciousness and reflection. Sartre's Gestalt roots might once again have been useful here. I fully expected the sentence which began 'The structure of the [perceptive] field' (p. 43) to end with something about the body-for-itself as the centre of the perceptive field in relation to which objects in that field are oriented and ordered. Instead it continues 'and some characteristics of objects within it, "reflect" one's project [i.e., possess valences]. This is why consciousness is always pre-reflectively [non-positionally] self-conscious'. (The phrase 'This is why' is not wholly self-explanatory; we will return to this.) It is not that there is any incompatibility between saying that the perceptive-cum-instrumental field is structured by our projects and saying that it is structured in relation to the body-for-itself; but the Lewinian notion of a vector (which, when transformed by Sartre, begins from the body-for-itself, its direction being determined by valences which depend on one's projects) would instantly have made it clear why, as well as bringing out the fact that the body-for-itself 'belongs to the structures of the non-thetic [non-positional] self-consciousness' (BN 434).

Chapter 3 then turns to the distinction between pure and impure reflection and explicates the notion of a psychic object. Much of this will be familiar to Sartre scholars, though seldom treated in such depth: 'Pure reflection does not introduce any new object into the world' (p. 50), whereas impure reflection constitutes 'psychic objects', e.g., states such as hatred, the ego being a 'unity' of such psychic objects. These psychic objects are compared and contrasted with material objects. Like material objects, psychic objects are 'revealed' through their aspects or adumbrations, i.e. they are seen as 'transcendent' or transphenomenal: we suppose them to persist through time, and to reveal themselves now in a moment of, say, repulsion, now in an upsurge of anger. Like material objects, they are also seen as possessing causal powers: I am annoyed with Pierre because I hate him. Unlike material objects, however, psychic objects are self-contradictory, 'participating simultaneously in the in-itself and in the for-itself' (BN 233); they are supposed in addition to be certain and to exist only insofar as they appear (which, of course, their adumbrations -- the momentary repulsion or anger -- are and do).

Thus far, this story is relatively familiar. It takes an unexpected turn here:

Although Sartre speaks of impure reflection as constituting and apprehending some sort of self-contradictory psychic objects, it may be better to think of impure reflection as an attempt to constitute an object that cannot properly be constituted without the experience of the Look. (p. 68)

This move takes us straight into Reisman's post-Strawsonian enterprise.

II: Post-Strawsonian enterprise

This book is, unfortunately, unlikely to be widely read by Anglo-American post-Strawsonian philosophers. The title -- oddly chosen in any case since there is rather little about Sartre's phenomenology except in the footnotes -- gives no hint of its more specific contents.

The Look of the Other plays a central role in Reisman's Sartre's answers to both post-Strawsonian questions. First, the Look 'brings with it a transition from a world that is objective only in that it is apprehended as an object of consciousness, to one that is genuinely objective' (p. 93), i.e. intersubjective: no longer simply the 'objective correlate' of my projects. Secondly, the Look realizes (i.e. makes real) those psychic objects, especially the ego, which are impure reflection's failed attempts to 'see itself from the outside'.

The argument for the role of the Look in giving rise to the objectivity of the world proceeds as follows (I paraphrase): to apprehend objects in the world as objective is to apprehend that they have valences other than those which stem from my projects. (Indeed perceiving an Other-as-object is potentially disturbing precisely because the Other, having his own freely chosen projects, may assign different valences, as A. Mirvish has stressed, e.g., in 'Sartre, hodological space, and the existence of others', Research in Phenomenology 14 (1984), pp. 149-73.) One can, however, become aware of this only if one has apprehended Others-as-subjects, which implies having been subjected to the Look. This argument is relatively straightforward; it clearly depends not only on defining objectivity as intersubjectivity, but on defining intersubjectivity in terms of the recognition of alternative valences. A more Merleau-Pontyan variant might begin from the idea that perspectivity -- the possession by perceived objects of horizons of unseen profiles -- is sufficient for objectivity; if an unseen profile is one that could be seen by another, one might still argue that objectivity depends on having experienced the Look.

Let me now raise a question: as we have seen, Reisman takes Sartre's view to be that 'the structure of the field, and some characteristics of objects within it, "reflect" one's project. This is why consciousness is always pre-reflectively self-conscious'. Why exactly? The thought appears to be that in being positionally conscious of objects in the perceptive-cum-instrumental field, I am non-positionally conscious of the projects which give the objects in that field their valences, and that this implies that I can in reflection become explicitly aware of the contribution of my projects to those valences. (Why else call it self-consciousness?) Yet the argument we are now considering appears to entail that I cannot be conscious that objects' qualities reflect my projects unless I recognise that others have different projects conferring different qualities, which recognition requires the Look. Does this not entail that even non-positional consciousness of consciousness depends on the Look?

One could make the same point in connection with the body-for-itself: in being positionally conscious of objects in the field, I am also non-positionally conscious of the centre of the field (i.e. the body-for-itself), hence I can in reflection become positionally conscious that my body is the centre of my perceptive-cum-instrumental field. Yet again, the argument we are now considering would appear to imply that I cannot reflect in this way unless I recognise that there are other centres to other fields. Once again, non-positional consciousness of consciousness appears to depend on the Look. (Much later, Reisman supposes an inconsistency in Sartre's usage of the phrase 'being-in-the-midst-of-the-world': in one passage -- 'my being-in-the-world, by the sole fact that it realizes a world, causes itself to be indicated to itself as a being-in-the-midst-of-the-world' -- '[t]here is no mention of the Other' (p. 125), whereas elsewhere -- 'to the extent that I am conscious of existing for the Other I apprehend my own facticity … in its flight toward a being-in-the-midst-of-the-world' -- the Look is crucial (p. 126). Could it not be that even the earlier passage implies the Look, despite there being no explicit mention of the Other?) Reisman clearly does not take non-positional consciousness of consciousness to require the Look; yet his own arguments might be taken to imply it.

We now turn to the argument for the role of the Look in enabling apprehension of ourselves as persons, i.e. psychophysical objects. We have seen already that impure reflection creates a new kind of 'object', viz. self-contradictory psychic objects; the Look too creates a new kind of object: a transcendence-transcended. Awareness of being Looked-at not only reveals the Other as a transcendence (a subject), it reveals oneself as a transcendence-transcended (a psychophysical object). This object which I am remains inapprehensible, but nonetheless I now have a concrete intuition that I have an 'outside'.

Thus far we are on familiar territory; Reisman's master stroke is the claim that this psychophysical object is the psychic object which my impure reflection constituted -- no longer a self-contradictory 'virtual' object but a real object. The Look of the Other has accomplished what impure reflection attempted but failed. Hence when Sartre writes that 'The body [for others] is the psychic object par excellence -- the only psychic object' (BN 455), he has not forgotten his earlier definition of 'psychic object', as one might naively suppose (and, I confess, I had myself supposed). On the contrary, what impure reflection was always blindly reaching for was the body-for-others. As Reisman also observes, this implies that 'impure reflection as well as the Look is involved in the self-consciousness that allows one to know oneself as a being-for-others' (p. 144 n.2) -- since, I suppose, one cannot succeed where one has not tried. Although Reisman does not pursue this, one can envisage arguments based on this point against some of the familiar criticisms of Sartre's account of the Look, in particular certain of those of William Schroeder (inexplicably rechristened 'Robert' in the index and footnotes of Reisman's book) in Sartre and his Predecessors (London: Routledge, 1984).

III: Bad faith

Reisman calls attention to Sartre's self-imposed requirement to 'observe strict order in discussion' (BN 297), and points out the difficulties which this requirement creates for Sartre's discussion of bad faith. Sartre's examples cannot fully be understood until he has clarified being-for-others.

Reisman makes two claims that bear further investigation: first, that both of the familiar forms of bad faith, which he characterises as 'reifying transcendence and denying it' (p. 118), involve impure reflection (p. 121); and, secondly, that there are two levels of bad faith, depending on whether the 'duplicity' exploited requires the Look.

The first claim is controversial since, as Reisman notes, some commentators take there to be a form of bad faith that precedes any reflection (p. 145 n.10). He has in mind those who identify bad faith with 'the transcendence/ facticity structure of unreflective consciousness', which, as Reisman argues, is a mistake. He does appear to conflate this incorrect view with a different one, one which identifies bad faith with the flight from this facticity/ transcendence structure. However, since this flight is motivated by anguish and given that anguish is the recognition of freedom in a moment of pure reflection, bad faith thus understood likewise cannot precede any reflection. Yet it does not follow that bad faith cannot occur unreflectively, if that is indeed what Reisman is claiming, and many passages (as well as examples) in Sartre's chapter on bad faith would seem to indicate otherwise. At the least -- especially in view of the depth of his exposition of impure reflection and psychic objects -- Reisman owes us a fuller explanation of their role in bad faith.

Moving on to Reisman's two levels of bad faith: he argues that two of Sartre's four duplicities, viz. facticity/ transcendence and the temporal ekstases, do not require the Look: they stay at the level of impure reflection; whereas being-in-the-world/ being-in-the-midst-of-the-world and being-for-itself/ being-for-others do require the Look. Here I will suggest that the earlier argument to the conclusion that even non-positional consciousness of consciousness depends on the Look modifies, without undermining, this distinction between levels; only the being-for-itself/ being-for-others duplicity belongs on the second level. There remains a distinction. Reisman notes that one and the same set of actions can manifest both levels:

Thus at the same time that the solicitous manner and mechanical movements of the waiter are signs of his denial that his role as waiter is one that he must actively realize, they are signs of his denial that the to-be-brought-to-the-tables quality of the food and the to-be-served quality of the customers are products of his choice. (p. 128)

Yet to be aware that these hodological qualities of objects in the world are products of his choice does, as I have already argued, depend on his having experienced the Look, but they do not depend, as his awareness of his (chosen) role as waiter, on his now being Looked at.

Difficult and flawed, yes, but also enormously thought-provoking. I remain unsure whether I have fully understood Reisman's arguments. But I am certain that this book will, and should, provoke a good deal of discussion among scholars of the early Sartre, and -- who knows? -- perhaps even among Anglo-American post-Strawsonians.