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Katherine J. Morris, Sartre, Blackwell Publishing, 2008, 184pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780631232797.

Reviewed by William L. McBride, Purdue University


This is the fifth volume in the Blackwell Great Minds series. The author has been a lecturer at Oxford University since 1986, but she was born in the United States: Her mother, to whom she dedicates this book, was the late Phyllis Morris, whose idea it was to found the North American Sartre Society, a still-flourishing institution. (She enlisted my assistance, and so we worked on the project together, but I have always made clear that it was her idea.) Phyllis Morris was a Sartre scholar in her own right, perhaps best known for her work on Sartre's concept of a person and on self-deception. She died far too young.

The book is well-written, generally careful and accurate in its philosophical claims, and skillful at showing, in a number of places, ways in which Sartre's critics have gotten him wrong, while still taking a distance from him on some issues. (Morris likes to use the word "nuance" as a verb -- as, e.g., on p. 99: she is not, she says, contradicting his claim about the relation between bodies and instruments, but "nuancing" it.) The book is also an exercise in challenging both those self-styled "analytic" philosophers who find no value in Continental European thought and those post-modernists and others who take Sartre to be passé, as the author explicitly says at one point in her introduction (p. xiii). In fact, I regard this aspect of the work -- that is, its probing and bridging of the analytic-Continental "gap" -- as perhaps its greatest single contribution to ongoing philosophical discussion, since in fulfilling its designated function of presenting the basic ideas of the early Sartre, especially the Sartre of Being and Nothingness, it must perforce go over many points that are already rather well known to Sartre scholars.

The book's structure is as follows: Following the introduction, there is a twenty-page summary of Sartre's life, and then there are two major sub-divisions and an exceedingly brief "postscript" about ethics. Both sub-divisions are divided into four sections. The first of the two begins with a useful treatment of Sartre's background in the method of Husserlian phenomenology, including a rebuttal to Daniel Dennett's claim that phenomenologists are really just doing anthropology; then interestingly explores the role of Sartrean phenomenology as a "therapy for intellectual prejudices" (p. 51), such as what Morris calls most philosophers' prejudice in favour of knowing over living; and concludes with a clear, standard account of Sartre on the nature of consciousness and then a section on bad faith. The titles of the four sections of the second sub-division are, simply, "The Body," "Life-space," "Others," and "Freedom." The author makes abundant use of Sartre's contemporary Maurice Merleau-Ponty, while (rightly, in my view) arguing that Merleau-Ponty actually built on Sartre's treatment of the lived body (p. xii), contrary to what many Merleau-Pontyans claim, and exhibiting skepticism over Merleau-Ponty's criticism that Sartre is too conceptual (p. 63). In fact, she makes good use of a number of diverse figures, from Kurt Lewin (in the section on life-space) to Ludwig Wittgenstein and Martin Heidegger (the two most frequently cited authors besides Merleau-Ponty and Sartre himself), without ever losing sight of her principal aim of explicating the main points of Sartre's early thought.

Among Morris' more salient claims in Sartre's defense with which I find agreement are that we should not always be looking for arguments in his texts (p. 55), since, if he is giving us good phenomenological descriptions, arguments are not always needed; and that the charge that Sartre's conception of freedom is "extreme" overlooks all that he has to say about the ineluctable role of the "situation" within which any free choice must be made (p. 144). In fact, one of the great values of Sartre's account of choosing, she points out, is to show just how complex choosing can be. Morris also offers a particularly strong defense of Sartre's account of reflection, arguing against her mother (p. 75) that such reflection is not and cannot be the same as introspection (which is modeled on the notion of perception and is therefore external rather than the kind of internal relationship that Sartrean reflection is), and against both her mother and Gilbert Ryle that introspection is really a kind of retrospection. Morris' account of Sartre's subtle understandings of nothingness, so completely misunderstood by A. J. Ayer (p. 46) in his early (1945) article on Sartre's thought, is another of the book's highlights.

Of course there are, as is to be expected, the occasional sentences or phrases with which even the sympathetic reader may be inclined to take issue. For instance, although some of the background to the war in Algeria is well explained, to refer to Sartre's "stance against France" (p. 14) near the end of that war is to equate "France" with the violent right-wing diehards of that time and an increasingly unpopular government policy. In the section on "the body" it is said, more or less in passing, that Sartre (wrongly) considers sexual desire focusing on the other's flesh as being in bad faith (p. 106); but this seems to me to be a considerable oversimplification of the very complex, and in fact not entirely negative, Sartrean account of desire in Being and Nothingness. And to make the assertion, at the beginning of the mini-chapter on ethics, that Sartre "never wrote a book on ethics" (p. 162) is to mislead the non-specialist reader, since an enormous work entitled, in English translation, Notebooks for an Ethics was written by Sartre but never published during his lifetime, largely because of his dissatisfaction with it.

To refer to the existence of these Notebooks, which are listed in the bibliography at the end of Morris' book but are not cited in the text, is to raise the central issue concerning the limitations of Sartre. For this book, except for a couple of pages in the brief biographical chapter, contains no analyses of Sartre's post-1946 philosophical writings. (His Existentialism Is a Humanism, which is briefly touched upon in the ethics chapter, was first published in 1946.) The author does acknowledge that his Critique of Dialectical Reason (p. xii -- it is called Critique of Dialectical Reasoning in this text) is philosophical and says that she sees much continuity in it from Being and Nothingness -- a point with which I agree. Her additional stated justifications for not dealing with the Critique are that Being and Nothingness already contains those "facets of his thinking which I particularly want to spotlight" -- fair enough -- and that to proceed on to the Critique would add much length and additional complexity to an already complicated undertaking. Later (p. 18), Morris calls the Critique Sartre's last philosophical work, thus clearly indicating her belief that The Family Idiot is a biography (of Flaubert), but is not philosophy, and that the posthumously published philosophical works such as the Notebooks (the date of composition of which was in fact prior to that of the Critique), somehow do not count, either, for her purposes.

While this is not an appropriate occasion for discussing what is and is not philosophy -- and in any event, the "Great Minds" series of which this book is a part includes two individuals not usually classified as philosophers, Darwin and Shakespeare -- I am inclined to believe that the exclusion of all Sartre's later work from consideration in this book gives it a somewhat truncated effect. Just to take one instance, the one-page discussion (pp. 137-38) of "the Us-object and the We-subject" as they were presented, quite unsatisfactorily especially with regard to the "we", in Being and Nothingness would have benefited from at least a reference to the very painstaking, nuanced way in which Sartre in the Critique analyzes various sorts of "we" formations while still refusing to give them the status of fully robust ontological entities. Even The Family Idiot, strange work that it is, presents us, I would argue, with many philosophically interesting challenges not found in Sartre's early work, such as its opening question of what, at this time, we can know about a particular individual -- in other words, the issue of optimal philosophical method that Sartre first raised explicitly in his prefatory essay to the Critique, entitled "Search for a Method". The appropriateness of making such a reference forward in time from 1946 would seem even greater if we consider the strong emphasis that Morris places in her first chapter on Husserlian phenomenology as Sartre's chosen methodology.

But Katherine Morris has chosen to confine her presentation and analysis to a number of very important questions from Being and Nothingness under the general headings that I have noted, and to a reasoned, generally positive account of Sartre's treatment of them in a way that brings him into dialogue with some of his best-known contemporaries and successors. And that is quite enough.