Saul Kripke

Placeholder book cover

Alan Berger (ed.), Saul Kripke, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 372pp., $36.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521674980.

Alexis Burgess, Stanford University

Reviewed by Alexis Burgess, Stanford University


If Kripke did not exist, it would be necessary to invent Him. If it were necessary to invent K, it would be possible to invent K. If K could be invented by J, and K innovated I, then J could have innovated I. For most ideas, I, recounted or reappraised in this first-rate collection of original essays on Kripke's philosophical work: only K could have innovated I. Therefore, in case you weren't sure: Kripke exists. Thank God.

Berger's anthology has been a long time coming, but it comes at a good time. Last year also saw the release of Kripke's first volume of collected papers, Philosophical Troubles. And if I might be forgiven one nepotistic plug: John Burgess's book on Kripke is due out later this year. It looks like the beginning of an overdue boom, fueled in part by the ongoing efforts of CUNY's Center for Kripkiana to make his voluminous unpublished work more widely available. (My illicit copy of the Locke Lectures has got to be third-generation, at least; and there are pages missing!) Troubles includes six of these "new" papers, and the Berger book offers expositions of no fewer than four further research projects, familiar from folklore but still in the archives: Kripke on nominalism about numbers, logical relativity, color, and functionalism. For better or worse, the only overlap between the two volumes, viz. this new material, is Nathan Salmon's treatment (in Berger) of Kripke's work on negative existentials and names in fiction (Troubles: Chapter 3). If you've seen Salmon's 1998 article on 'Nonexistence', you'll already know the punchline: 'Holmes doesn't exist' means that there's no true proposition that Holmes exists. I know; I know. In Kripke's defense, he's pretty unimpressed by the idea himself.

The bulk of Berger is actually devoted to discussion of classic Kripke: the two little books, and many of the famous, published essays reproduced in Troubles. The contributors are distinguished and (jointly) numerous. Obviously I can't do them all justice here. My foci below are dictated by three aims: (i) to give a reasonably cohesive picture, in this brief review, of Kripke's general philosophical outlook; (ii) to highlight some of the less familiar material; and (iii) to offer a few reflections of my own.

In the preface to Syntactic Structures, Chomsky champions rigor in linguistics for both its positive and negative potential (5):

By pushing a precise but inadequate formulation to an unacceptable conclusion, we can often expose the exact source of this inadequacy and, consequently, gain a deeper understanding of the linguistic data. More positively, a formalized theory may automatically provide solutions for many problems other than those for which it was explicitly designed.

Kripke sometimes comes under fire for using the power of precision more negatively than positively. He gives us "pictures" to replace the meticulously formulated views attributed to his opponents, and allegedly refuted by cunning counter-examples. But I think there's a more charitable way to see his methodology. Unlike mathematical generalizations, universally quantified claims in philosophy are, quite plausibly, as Kripke famously said, almost always false. The quip was facetious; but then again, truth is often funnier than fiction. His emphasis on the negative is a natural expression of a sensible, non-reductive realism about most philosophical topics: reference in Lecture II of Naming and Necessity, consciousness in Lecture III, meaning in the Wittgenstein book, and the mental more generally in his "refutation" of functionalism. Not to mention color, or Nozick on knowledge. Everything is what it is, and not another thing.

I hadn't really noticed, before reading the Berger book, just how many of these campaigns are directed against specifically dispositional or counterfactual reductions. Come to think of it, I don't actually know whether Kripke even believes in dispositional properties. If he did, I'm pretty sure he'd object to counterfactual reductions of them too. But he was busy exposing the so-called conditional fallacy elsewhere. Ironically, just yards away, David Lewis was busy building contemporary analytic metaphysics out of the modal materials he and Kripke had double-handedly rescued from Quine's influential attacks. (I wonder whether there's a critique of counterfactual theories of causation somewhere in the archives.) One of Berger's gems is a little piece by Bob Stalnaker comparing Lewis and Kripke on the metaphysics of modality -- an instantly indispensable companion to the brief remarks in the preface to Naming & Necessity. I'd like to focus here, though, on Kripke's anti-dispositionalism.

Take the colors. When one first learns of metamers (i.e., strikingly different spectral reflectance profiles that nevertheless give rise to strikingly similar color experiences), it can be very tempting to conclude that science has effectively refuted the existence of "objective" color properties. We would still have our sensations, of course; and we could still say that different objects are stably disposed to stimulate different color experiences. But the similarity space native to color phenomenology, one might argue, just doesn't reflect any structure out there in the world. Contrast this kind of error theory with dispositionalism, which tries to rescue objective (if not intrinsic) colors using biconditionals along the lines of: (R) A surface is red iff it would look-red under conditions C.

Mario Gómez-Torrente contributes a terrific, sympathetic presentation of Kripke's arguments against dispositionalism, based on recordings/transcripts of seminars/talks at Princeton/Michigan in the late 80s. Killer yellow -- that legendary, blindingly bright hue mentioned already in Naming & Necessity -- is just the tip of the spectrum. In fact, as it turns out, modal counter-examples like this one take a back seat in the discussion to epistemic arguments against the apriority of biconditionals like R (given what C has to include just to ensure material adequacy). The details are much more interesting than word-of-mouth accounts may have suggested. But the basic thought is just that dispositionalists, like descriptivists about proper names and natural kind terms, have mistaken a perfectly good reference-fixing description for a reductive analysis. (Incidentally, Bernard Linsky and Scott Soames both revisit Kripke on nouns and the necessary aposteriori. Linsky offers a particularly interesting synthesis of the literature on the rigidity of general terms (35-43), and Soames carefully distinguishes the epistemic statuses of essentialist and identity-based necessities. But let's get back to color.)

If 'red' is a natural kind term, metamers would suggest that it's a failed natural kind term. Kripke thinks the rumors of metamers have been greatly exaggerated, and seems to put his own money on a kind of scientifically-informed realism about the colors. I don't know enough of the relevant science (then or now) to place a bet. But I can say that Kripke's arguments against error theory are less convincing than his case against dispositionalism. The main consideration seems to be that any argument from metamers to error theory would prove too much. As Gómez-Torrente reconstructs the point:

presumably many or all predicates for sensible qualities fail to appear as usually understood in the system of classification of fundamental levels of current physics, which makes our system of classification of primary qualities Goodmanian also on these grounds. (299)

In other words, if we reject colors because they'd be too disjunctive or gerrymandered, we should do the same for "primary" qualities like shapes and sizes. Or take heat. Further down the page we're invited to "think again of the use of the notion of heat in thermodynamics, which is compatible with the causes [better: bases] of heat being diverse from the point of view of more fundamental levels of physical description". I'm underwhelmed. These arguments from analogy just take it for granted that some special science essentially involves objective color terms. But color science seems to be about the causal relationships between color sensations and physical conditions best described in colorless terms. What about other sciences? As Gómez-Torrente reminds us: "we are taught in chemistry class that we can test for acidity and alkalinity by seeing whether litmus paper turn red or blue." (298) If this is the best argument against error theory, game over.

However this may be, Kripke's Wittgenstein (KW) would seem to be much less sympathetic to realism about meaning than Kripke is to realism about color. Dispositionalism is twice renounced. But the skeptical solution to KW's puzzle appears to rest on a nonfactualism about meaning attributions, which many commentators have found absurd or even self-undermining. (See for example Paul Boghossian's classic, 'The Status of Content'.) In his contribution to the collection, George Wilson reads KW as a factualist about meaning attributions. Scott Soames has made a similar case. Here's how I would put the point. To jettison "the classical realist picture of meaning", as KW does, is at minimum to give up the correspondence theory of truth. But the alternatives don't seem to sustain nonfactualism. Deflationism about truth threatens to convert failures of bivalence into logical contradictions, jeopardizing nonfactualism about anything. And more pragmatic or epistemic accounts of truth, together with the skeptical solution, would seem to reinstate quite a lot of meaning facts. Indeed, on Wilson's reconstruction, KW ought to say that the facts about meaning are determined by the ways in which we and our communities use (and are disposed to use) the words in our languages.

Now, this looks suspiciously like a "straight" solution to the paradox: a familiar, communitarian variation on the dispositionalism dispatched earlier. And as Wilson notes, Kripke explicitly says that the objections to solopsistic dispositionalism (from error and finitude) will carry over to the communitarian case. So what gives? Well, the proposal seems to be that we reconceptualize the straight/skeptical distinction to concern the determinacy of meaning facts. A straight solution, on this reading, would deliver a unique, totally-defined function over pairs of numbers as the meaning of 'plus'. KW's skeptical solution, by contrast, acknowledges that the standards of usage established by a linguistic community are only partial. My main reservation about this reconstruction of Wilson on Kripke on Wittgenstein (WKW) is that it seems to entail that we don't mean addition by 'plus'. For addition is totally-defined. But WKW pretty clearly wants to say that we do mean addition by 'plus'. Synthesis: the meaning of 'plus', though indeterminate, determinately coincides with the meaning of 'addition'!

I think there's a much simpler response to the skeptical challenge available. To begin with, the claim that (determinate) meaning facts supervene on fundamental physical facts is hardly refuted by human failure to articulate the grounding relations that explain this supervenience. No one can say exactly how chemistry reduces to physics; but almost everyone thinks it does. (If there's something special about "normative" domains, it certainly hasn't stopped metaethicists from embracing the supervenience of the moral on the natural.) The truth about meaning is equally complicated, involving an intricate interplay of biological, psychological, environmental, and sociological contingencies.

What's more, we can actually answer Kripke's skeptic without even sketching this story. Recall that there are two versions of the skeptical challenge, querying past and present meaning respectively. Kripke sets the latter aside:

before we pull the rug out from under our own feet, we begin by speaking as if the notion that at present we mean a certain function by 'plus' is unquestioned and unquestionable. Only past usages are to be questioned. Otherwise, we will be unable to formulate our problem. (13-14; original emphasis)

But the historical version of the skeptical challenge can be answered thusly.

We typically (tacitly) intend to use our words stably over time, with the same meanings from one day to the next. I take it for granted that when I order an "omelet" for brunch, I'm using the term with the same meaning it had last Sunday. Now, the skeptic grants for the sake of argument that 'omelet', as we presently use it, means omelet. He simply wonders what rules out the skeptical hypothesis that last Sunday it meant quomelet. Having noted our "stabilizing" intentions, it's tempting to respond as follows. If I had meant quomelet, then my stabilizing intention would have guaranteed that I continue to mean quomelet; but that's inconsistent with my meaning omelet today. This response fails because the skeptic questions the contents of all past representational states, intentions included. Perhaps I intended to use the word 'omelet' with the quomelet meaning . . .

But there's a better response in the vicinity. Since the skeptic grants that I presently intend to use 'omelet' with whatever meaning it had last Sunday, and he grants that I presently mean omelet by it, he'll be hard pressed to deny that the success of my stabilizing intention is the best explanation of my present meaning. How else did I wind up meaning omelet by 'omelet'? But the success of my present intention entails that I used to mean omelet by 'omelet', which is the desired anti-skeptical result. Does this inference to the best explanation beg any questions? My present stabilizing intention is admittedly in part "about" the past. But the mere existence of the intention (as opposed to its satisfaction) doesn't logically entail any historical, representational claims. We need something like inference to the best explanation to bridge the gap. And though this rule of inference is evidently fallible, it can at the very least be used to shift the burden of proof back onto the skeptic.

The word limit is fast approaching and I haven't yet said much about the mental. In an epic footnote (n24) to his discussion of dispositionalism, Kripke suggests that his objections extend to functionalist theories of mind. In Naming & Necessity, Kripke was unduly cautious about whether his arguments against various forms of identity theory extend to functionalism. As Sydney Shoemaker rightly emphasizes in his eloquent review of Lecture III's legacy, Kripke's arguments threaten the supervenience of the mental on the physical, full stop. But this is to attack functionalism at its weakest point: consciousness. In various unpublished lectures on functionalism, Kripke attacks it at its strongest point: what Chalmers calls the "psychological" aspects of mind. In his contribution to the Berger volume, Jeff Buechner carefully reconstructs this fabled refutation of functionalism -- which, unlike the rule-following arguments, Kripke presents in his own voice. The basic thought is familiar enough. Never mind qualia, there are infinitely many functional characterizations of our minds compatible with their categorical and dispositional properties physicalistically described, but incompatible with each other. The point applies to humans, dogs, and calculators alike. So, in an interesting epicycle: if one tries to solve the calculator problem by appealing to the intentions of its designers, regress threatens.

I think Kripke's the one who's proving too much now. Parallel arguments would undermine the pretentions of any "special" or macro science, which inevitably trade in ceteris paribus generalizations. Deviant functional characterizations of the mind can be justifiably ruled out on the grounds that they attribute gerrymandered causal structure to the psychological world. But to get to the bottom of this we'd probably have to probe KW's remarks on the appeal to "simplicity" in science and philosophy. Anyway, suffice it to say that the articles I've mentioned are already collectively well worth the price of the book. I won't reproduce the table of contents here, but rest assured there's much more where this came from. Let me just end with a quote that resonated with me, from the acknowledgements to Mark Richard's thoughtful essay on Pierre: "thanks to Saul Kripke for providing a model of how philosophy can be rigorous and accessible, genuinely significant and still fun." (234)