Saussure's Philosophy of Language as Phenomenology: Undoing the Doctrine of the Course in General Linguistics

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Beata Stawarska, Saussure's Philosophy of Language as Phenomenology: Undoing the Doctrine of the Course in General Linguistics, Oxford University Press, 2015, 286pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190213022.

Reviewed by Anna Petronella Foultier, Stockholm University


The publication a century ago of the Course in General Linguistics, allegedly by Ferdinand de Saussure, was a main impetus behind modern linguistics as well as the structuralist and post-structuralist movements.[1] Going back to the "founding father"[2] of these movements is therefore not only of historical interest but also of great philosophical importance, in particular since this influential book was the product of a rather high-handed editorial process by Saussure's colleagues, Charles Bally and Albert Sechehaye, who had not been present at the actual courses.

Although the student notes and many other manuscript sources have been in print for several decades,[3] the more widespread reassessment of Saussure's thought in light of these sources is relatively recent. The received interpretation of his linguistics, made famous through the structuralists, has mainly been called into question regarding: (1) the notion that the theory was based on a series of dichotomies -- signifier versus signified, language system (langue) versus speech (parole), synchrony versus diachrony, etc. -- where the system was thought as static and closed; and (2) the belief that the emphasis upon the linguistic system must be diametrically opposed to phenomenology'sf insistence on the speaking subject and its meaning-giving operations. The reinterpretation of Saussure has been developed especially in French[4] but also to some extent in English scholarship.[5]

Beata Stawarska claims in this book that the structuralist interpretation of Saussure (based on Bally's and Sechehaye's edition) is still the official doctrine in the Anglophone world. She undertakes to "undo" this dogma, uncovering its roots in the editorial transformations of the original student notes. Moreover, Stawarska takes on the "challenge" raised by one of the foremost contemporary Saussure scholars, Simon Bouquet, to investigate the largely unexplored philosophical dimension of Saussure's thought (p. 7). The result is a solid piece of exegesis. In Part I Stawarska goes through the received doctrine, tracing it back to the manuscript sources, not only to gauge its validity but also to disclose its genesis through the editorial choices. In Part II, she tackles the philosophical side of Saussure's reflection, insisting that it can be interpreted as a "linguistic phenomenology" -- not so much, as might be expected, in the sense of Husserl or Merleau-Ponty but more surprisingly by way of Hegel's phenomenology. In Part III she discusses the "inception and reception" of the doctrine with regard to the institutional background and to Bally's and Sechehaye's own theoretical commitments that governed the organisation of material and, according to her, made it into a "ghostwritten text" (p. 19).

This is only a broad outline, though. Intermingled with these general interpretative efforts, Stawarska (ironically) deconstructs Derrida's well-known allegation that Saussure adheres to a metaphysics of presence. She sets Saussure's thought in relation to Bergson, Husserl and Merleau-Ponty. She traces the background of his ideas to Polish linguists Baudouin de Courtenay and Mikołaj Kruszewski and to Roman Jakobson, and she considers his influence on Lévi-Strauss and Lacan, among others. Stawarska criticises the narrow view of structuralism as mainly a French phenomenon and points to the reception of Saussure's ideas in Eastern Europe. Finally, in two appendices she discusses the English translations of the Course and the reasons why the major portion of his work was never published in his lifetime.

This manifold of intermingled arguments and ideas makes Stawarska's book a rich source of suggestions for further research while clearly demonstrating that the firm opposition between structuralism (considered as a monolithic movement) and phenomenology must be abandoned. She also makes it evident for the English-speaking reader that Saussure's language system was never intended as a static, ahistorical and closed entity, separable from the speaking subject and the social world. The dismantling of Derrida's reading of Saussure is particularly successful and should become a classic (the only pity is that it is in two different parts of the book). Stawarska shows that Derrida, in spite of his critique of the "civilization of the book" (p. 251), in discussing Saussure rests firmly attached to the Book with a capital B. If Derrida had consulted the manuscripts he would have noticed that the passages corroborating his criticism were frequently inventions by the editors, whereas the sources are, to the contrary, often in coherence consistent with his own thought. But Stawarska shows that Derrida silences his potential critics by claiming that any appeal to a "hidden", truer text (i.e., the manuscripts) behind the Course would merely confirm his own reading by revealing the reader's "commitment to metaphysics of presence, and fundamental misunderstanding of the project of deconstruction" (p. 253).

Stawarska writes well; her book is often both pleasant to read and thought-provoking. However, the richness of ideas and interconnected themes is perhaps also one of its weakest points: while an important groundwork is laid down for English-speaking philosophers and linguists, the positive theses are difficult to sort out. We get a critique of earlier interpretations that sometimes borders on straw-man arguments. For one thing, the structuralist development of Saussure's linguistics were not intended to be a truthful exegesis. In addition, this multifarious movement is more often than not presented as equivalent to the rather unsophisticated dogma of closed and rigid structures. Moreover, even though Stawarska is absolutely right in pointing out the distortions of Saussure's ideas by the editors, the claim that the Saussure they produced is a "metaphysical traditionalist who maintained the received notion of a sign considered as a positive unity of sound and sense" (p. 79) is a perfect hyperbole. The editors put together an often highly equivocal work, but enough of Saussure's original ideas transpired for early interpreters to discern their ingenuity.[6]

More importantly, in her aspiration to knock down the received dichotomous constructions, Stawarska ends up with metaphors that are more confusing than helpful. For example, in describing language as "a web of complex, crisscrossing" relations of interdependent terms (p. 147), where the logic of "violent hierarchies" associated with the Course "gives way to another logic of chiasmatic interdependency between nonhierarchical terms" (p. 148), we get no hint at what was revolutionary about Saussure's ideas. Merleau-Ponty's much overused metaphor of the chiasm is downright misleading here: if it is an important achievement to show that neither the distinction between langue and parole nor that between synchrony and diachrony are rigid ontological dichotomies for Saussure, this does not imply in any sense that they are simply intertwined.

In fact, Saussure repeatedly emphasises the importance of upholding a distinction between these perspectives for a reason: for him, general linguistics should help us understand thefunctioning of language, and this requires us to take the viewpoint of the speaking subject. In contrast to the dominant paradigm in linguistics at the time, according to which general linguistic principles must be based on historical facts, Saussure took linguistic practice as his point of departure. Since the speaker does not necessarily know anything about the history of his or her language, it is not through the diachronic perspective that we can gain an understanding of its functioning. This is clearly a methodological choice, but one that must be maintained. As Stawarska herself points out, linguistic facts are not given independently but are contingent on the viewpoint adopted (p. 117). In other words, the synchronic point of view constituteslanguage as a system of oppositional, differentially and negatively determined values and cannot simply be intertwined with the diachronic perspective. The latter will constitute a different theoretical object.

In her discussion of the analogy, Stawarska reveals a fundamental paradox in Saussure's linguistics presented by him as a general principle of creativity in language (and thus, one would imagine, of change). However, since Saussure insists (also in the manuscripts) that analogy is a synchronic phenomenon, he admits a problem: if there is innovation there is change, and thus one enters the diachronic perspective. This is definitely a part of Saussure's thought that merits investigation, but to some extent Stawarska dodges the paradox when she claims that the analogy implies "a logic of chiasmatic interdependency" (p. 148). But the question remains how such an interdependency would be possible: according to Saussure's own principles, the analogy must occur in the synchronic realm and the distinction with diachrony be maintained, since the whole of the language system is needed in order for the analogy to have meaning.[7]

This being said, Stawarska's book is erudite and inspiring, and my objections might as well be raised to the editor who did not push for a more coherent line of argument. Something similar can be said about the copy-editing: while the multilingual approach is welcome, with plenty of original quotes and references, it is quite annoying that they are so studded with typos (also, it is not clear why certain French citations are not translated, since the book is explicitly directed at an English-speaking audience). Further, references are repeatedly confusing or missing; this is particularly disturbing in a work whose main theses rely upon original sources. Is Oxford University Press unable to afford solid editing and proof-reading?

[1] Cours de linguistique générale, Paris: Payot and Rivages, 1967/1972 (1916).

[2] In the words of François Dosse, Histoire du structuralisme, I. Le Champ du signe, 1945 -- 1966, Paris: La Découverte, 1992, p. 62.

[3] Robert Godel, Les Sources manuscrites du cours de linguistique générale de F. de Saussure, Geneva: Droz, 1957; Cours de linguistique généralevol. I and vol. II, critical edition of the student notes by Rudolf Engler, Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz, 1968 and 1974. In contrast to the former editions, Tullio de Mauro's rich critical edition of the Course (in Italian 1967 and in French 1972), is widely accessible in print. More recent is Écrits de linguistique générale, eds. Simon Bouquet and R. Engler, Paris: Gallimard, 2002 (Writings in General Linguistics, trans. Carol Sanders and Matthew Pires, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006).

[4] E.g., S. Bouquet, Introduction à la lecture de Saussure, Paris: Payot, 1997; Claudine Normand, Saussure, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2000; Johannes Fehr, Saussure entre linguistique et sémiologie, Paris: P.U.F., 2000; Bouquet (ed.), Ferdinand de Saussure, Paris: Herne, 2003; Michel Arrivé, À la recherche de Ferdinand de Saussure, Paris: P.U.F., 2007.

[5] E.g., Raymond Tallis, Not Saussure: A Critique of Post-Saussurean Literary Theory, Basingstoke: Macmillan, 1988/1995; Paul J. Thibault, Re-reading Saussure: The Dynamics of Signs in Social Life, London: Routledge, 1997; Carol Sanders (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Saussure, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.

[6] Not the least Maurice Merleau-Ponty, as acknowledged by Stawarska in the section on his interpretation (pp. 181f.).

[7] In the student notes, the remark comes up again and again; e.g.: "Il faut un fait synchronique pour produire l'analogie, il faut l'ensemble [le système] de la langue." Engler, 1968, 390 B, 2591.