Saving Truth from Paradox

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Hartry Field, Saving Truth from Paradox, Oxford University Press, 2008, 406pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199230747.

Reviewed by José Martínez Fernández, Universitat de Barcelona and Jordi Valor Abad, Universitat de València



Saving Truth from Paradox (STFP henceforth) is one of the most impressive works on semantic paradoxes to have appeared in recent years. Though written with great clarity and meticulous rigour, the difficulty of the issues dealt with, the density of the argumentative structure and the width of the ground covered by the author turn reading STFP into a laborious and yet highly-rewarding task. The book, a must-read for everyone interested in semantic paradoxes (or in philosophical logic more generally), develops a highly-sophisticated theory of truth that aims at solving the resilient problems posed by the Liar Paradox.

We become entangled in the Liar Paradox when we reason about a sentence, Q, that turns out to be logically equivalent to a sentence asserting Q’s falsity or -- in the version we will focus on here -- to a sentence asserting Q’s untruth: ¬True(<Q>). By appealing to quite naïve assumptions about the meaning of the truth predicate, in particular to a semantic principle as basic as Tarski’s T-Schema:

(TS) True(<A>) ↔ A,

we can easily infer (*) from Q’s instance of TS:

(*) True(<Q>) ↔ ¬True(<Q>).

But, in classical logic, (*) leads to the contradiction:

(+) True(<Q>) ∧ ¬True(<Q>).

Most theories of truth try to solve the Liar Paradox by restricting TS in one way or another, but in STFP Hartry Field argues that this is a mistake. He describes as logical dogmatism the view that restricting semantic principles like TS should always be preferred to revising classical logic. The truth predicate is, according to him, "a device of infinite conjunction or disjunction (or, more accurately, a device of quantification)" (p. 210) and this means that it mainly plays a logical role, one that crucially depends on TS and on the "transparency" of the truth predicate, understood along the lines of the following Intersubstitutivity Principle:

(IP) For every sentence A, the substitution in any non-opaque sentential context of any occurrence of a sentence B by True (<B>) (or vice versa) results in a sentence logically equivalent to A.

If Field’s deflationary view about truth is correct, restricting TS or IP need not be any less harmful for our ordinary understanding of meaning and logic than restricting other logical principles concerning terms such as ‘or’, ‘and’, ‘not’, etc., would be. A revision of the logic of truth is also a revision of logic. So, when assessing an alleged solution to the Liar Paradox, it is the whole logic plus truth theory that should be evaluated.

A problem for most theories of truth is that they are unable to express consistently their own solution to the Liar. When they try to do so, they fall prey to strengthened versions of the paradox. For instance, theories that declare that Q is neither true nor false are forbidden from saying so in the language of the theories, since that assertion would imply that Q is not true, reinstating the paradox again. Field tries to overcome these expressive limitations by introducing a predicate of determinateness, D, into the language. Pathological sentences are then classified as being neither determinately true nor determinately false. The challenge is to show that the semantics of D fully characterizes all pathological sentences without creating new paradoxes.

Field’s goal in STFP is to offer a theory of truth for a language L+ which contains its own truth predicate that meets the following conditions:

  1. It preserves IP in L+.
  2. It respects TS.
  3. It is free of semantic paradoxes: not only paradoxes concerning the truth predicate (the Liar, Curry), but also paradoxes about the predicate ‘true of’ (Grelling) and paradoxes of definability (Berry and König).
  4. It contains a predicate of determinateness, D, in order to characterize problematic sentences;
  5. And it does this while avoiding the "revenge problem" (strengthened versions of the paradoxes).
  6. In fulfilling 1-5, it alters classical logic as little as possible, so as not to cripple ordinary reasoning.

Together with these major goals, Field also pursues a secondary (but relevant and ambitious) goal in STFP: to give an account of truth that deals with the Sorites Paradox, while respecting the intuition that vague predicates do not have sharp boundaries. The D predicate can be used to characterize sentences that fail to be determinately true due to the presence of vague predicates. Field’s aim is to show that iteration of the D predicate does not generate sharp boundaries at any point.

STFP is structured in five parts. The first contains selective background on relevant issues related to the Liar Paradox and the concept of truth. In the first two chapters, Field reviews the ways in which a language can express self-referential sentences and the consequences that Tarski’s theorem has for the project of defining truth. Tarski’s theorem affects the common definition of validity in terms of (logically) necessary preservation of truth and opens a gap between truth definitions for restricted and unrestricted languages. A related topic is also introduced in chapter 2: an ideal for a theory of truth would be for all of its axioms to be true and all of its rules to be truth preserving. But if this ideal were met, we could prove by induction the soundness of the theory and conclude its consistency from its soundness, contradicting Gödel’s second incompleteness theorem. So every theory (and that, of course, includes Field’s own solution) has to fall short of this ideal. In the rest of the book, when Field analyses several different theories of truth, he always carefully determines where the intuitive argument for soundness breaks down; thereby, in a sense, measuring the degree of self-reflection of the theories. In chapter 3, Field presents Kripke’s theory of truth as based on Kleene’s strong logic. Although this theory preserves IP, Kleene’s conditional is so weak that even the law A → A is invalid and therefore TS does not hold unrestrictedly. Furthermore, the theory has well-known expressive limitations and cannot characterize paradoxical sentences. These limitations are partly overcome by adopting Luckasiewicz’s infinite-valued propositional logic (ch. 4). In such a semantic framework we can keep IP and TS and define a ‘determinateness’ operator D that can be used to characterize paradoxical sentences. Unfortunately, this theory has to be kept at the propositional level, since Field shows that adding quantifiers would create new paradoxes (formulated in terms of transfinite iterations of the D operator). Part I of STFP also includes an interlude on vagueness and the paradoxes of definability (ch. 5).

The second part of the book offers a wide critical survey of most of the best-known approaches to the Liar Paradox that restrict IP and TS, but try to minimize the cost of doing so. Field describes these theories -- a bit misleadingly perhaps -- as "broadly classical", meaning that before the dilemma: "Should we restrict TS or some classical principle?" they always embraced the first option. Here, he discusses gap and glut theories (chs. 7-8), supervaluationist and revision rule theories (chs. 10-12), as well as stratified and contextual truth theories (ch. 14). For him, the main problem with all these theories is their failure to preserve IP and the damage this causes to the logical function of the truth predicate (ch. 13). A second problem with these theories is that they fail to self-reflect in damaging ways: they declare some of their own axioms untrue or declare some of their own rules not to be unrestrictedly truth-preserving.

In the third and fourth parts of STFP (chs. 15-23) Field develops his paracomplete theory of truth. Then in the fifth and last part of the book (chs. 24-27) he discusses versions of Priest’s paraconsistent dialetheism. These two theories solve paradoxes by restricting classical logic: paracomplete solutions stop the inference from (*) to (+); dialetheists accept (+), but restrict the explosion rule so that (+) does not imply everything.

We trust that this sketch of STFP will convince the reader of the hopeless task of giving a detailed discussion of the content of the book in the pages of this review. In what follows, we will outline Field’s paracomplete solution to the paradoxes and discuss some aspects of it.


The technical development of Field’s solution starts from a ground first-order language L that lacks a truth predicate and contains the usual logical constants plus Field’s conditional: ‘→’ (ch. 16). He considers the non-logical symbols of L interpreted in a classical model M. Next, he expands L into a language, L+, which contains a truth predicate ‘T’. The sentences of L+ will initially be interpreted according to Kleene’s strong logic in a semantic framework with three truth-values: {0, ½, 1}. The most relevant feature of Field’s semantics is the way conditionals are evaluated. Field combines ideas coming from different truth theories to create the semantics of L+ He uses Kripkean fixed points to define the interpretation of the truth predicate and revision rules to define the interpretation of the conditional operator. The interpretations are constructed in a transfinite series of stages. In the process, all formulas which are conditionals are considered as (generalized) atomic formulas. Initially, we have a valuation, v0, that assigns to all conditionals the value ½.[1] Using M, v0 is extended to all atomic formulas. By applying Kripke’s Kleene-based minimal fixed point construction, Field reaches a valuation, X0, for the truth predicate that respects IP. But conditionals do not get a compositional semantics at the valuation determined by X0 since all of them have value ½ independently of the values of their antecedents and consequents. Revision rules are introduced at this point to deal with this problem. A new valuation for conditionals, v1, is defined according to the following rule: v1 assigns 0 to a conditional when the value of its antecedent (with respect to X0) is greater than the value of its consequent (with respect to X0), and assigns 1 otherwise. Thus, v1 enables us to construct another Kripkean fixed point, X1, which provides a new interpretation to the truth predicate, one, moreover, that affords a more adequate evaluation for the conditionals. This construction can be transfinitely iterated using this rule of revision (|A|α represents the value of sentence A at stage α): [2]

|A → B|α = 1 if (∃β < α) (∀γ) [γ ≤ β < α → |A|γ ≤ |B|γ]

= 0 if (∃β < α) (∀γ) [γ ≤ β < α → |A|γ > |B|γ]

= ½ otherwise.

Under the revision process, each sentence A behaves in one of the following three ways. Either there is an ordinal, α, such that |A|α = 1 at all ordinals β ≥ α, or there is an ordinal, α, such that at |A|α = 0 at all β ≥ α, or neither of these two situations obtains. In the first two cases, we say that A’s ultimate value is 1 or 0 respectively; in the third case, A’s ultimate value is ½. The third case covers very different situations (A eventually gets constant value ½ after some ordinal α, or A’s truth-value oscillates between two or more truth-values throughout the revision procedure following different patterns). The ultimate values of the formulas of L+ provide a three-valued semantics for L+ that satisfies IP and TS and has a conditional that respects many classical rules and principles (sect. 17.4).

Field analyses several aspects of this construction in detail. For instance, he shows in sect. 16.2 that there are ordinals, α, such that the value of each sentence at stage α in the process coincides with its ultimate value (acceptable ordinals). Given that the Kleene rules for connectives hold throughout the revision process, this ensures that the ultimate values of formulas other than conditionals respect Kleene’s compositional semantics. Moreover, in sect. 17.1 Field offers an algebraic semantics on an infinite set of truth-values that makes the different patterns of revision of the sentences explicit and that gives a compositional semantics to the conditional.[3]

This semantics offers a paracomplete theory of truth, i.e., one in which the Law of Excluded Middle (LEM) is invalid. According to Field, it is indeterminate whether some sentences containing vague predicates are true: this already shows that LEM is contentious. Moreover, by rejecting LEM, a natural proof of (+) from (*) is blocked. Unfortunately, this sacrifice is not enough. We need to restrict other classically valid rules of inference and principles in order to block the Liar Paradox and other semantic paradoxes (such as Curry’s Paradox). The rules of Reductio ad Absurdum (RA) and Conditional Proof (CP) are the most significant losses. But laws governing conditionals such as importation, exportation or contraction are not generally valid either. Furthermore, many classical patterns of reasoning are validated only in the rule form, not in the law form. For instance, modus ponens is valid (A, A → B |= B), but |≠ (A ∧ (A → B)) → B. Field justifies this asymmetry by appealing to the difference between conditional assertion and assertion of a conditional: the latter has more stringent conditions than the former (sects. 17.4, 10.6-7). He also points out that these losses are not very damaging since, in the case where all the premises satisfy LEM, classical logic can be safely applied. In contradistinction to the bad self-reflection properties of other theories, the paracomplete theory declares all its axioms true and all its truth rules truth-preserving, even though it refrains from declaring some of its other logic rules truth-preserving.

With this logic, Field claims to have fulfilled goals 1, 2 and 3 mentioned above. With respect to goal 4, Field uses his conditional to define a determinateness operator, D, that can be used to describe defective sentences without, at least apparently, falling prey to new paradoxes (as expressed in goal 5). The operator D satisfies that: |= DA → A and that DA is, in general, stronger than A. When A is a pathological sentence, ¬DA ∧ ¬D¬A will be a true sentence expressing that A is defective.[4] Other properties of the determinateness operator can be found in sect. 15.2. Field shows there that in his semantics, if we define DA as A ∧ ¬(A → ¬A), the operator D satisfies the right properties. This shows that the operator is definable in the language; hence no worries about the consistency of the new operator arise.

Using the new operator and Gödel’s diagonal theorem we can form a new liar-like sentence, Q1, which is logically equivalent to ¬DQ1. A correct classification of this sentence cannot be given by ¬DQ1, on pain of contradiction, but in Field’s semantics we can prove that ¬DDQ1. Again this invites the creation of a new liar-like sentence, Q2, which is logically equivalent to ¬DDQ2. In general, there are sentences Qα such that Qα is logically equivalent to ¬DαQα when α is a finite ordinal and 'Dα' stands for α concatenations of the D operator. But the construction can be extended to the limit case, ω, with the definition of DωA as '∀α<ω True(<DαA>)'. The question then arises of how far this construction can be extended into the transfinite ordinals. Field shows that the construction works well for ordinals that are hereditarily definable in L+ (i.e., that can be defined in L+ and such that all previous ordinals are also definable in L+). The key point of the construction is that as long as Dα can be hereditarily defined in the language, the corresponding sentence Qα will not produce a paradox (because the instance of LEM, DαQα ∨ ¬DαQα, will be inadmissible) and Qα will be correctly classified as ¬Dα+1Qα. The Strengthened Liar for this Liar hierarchy of sentences, intuitively, would be a sentence, Q, equivalent to ¬DQ, where DA expresses the fact that A is DαA, for all Dα in the Liar Hierarchy. But if DA quantifies over all well-behaved iterations of the D operator, it will itself be badly behaved and will not produce a new paradox. This can be made precise in different ways and Field argues that none of them produces a new paradox (ch. 22). For him, this supports the idea that his language has no need to be expanded and is sufficiently powerful to serve as its own metalanguage.


A natural question to ask at this point is: Why should we adopt Field’s Logic? Any discussion about logical matters has a normative dimension. After describing a logical system, it always makes sense to ask whether we should reason according to it. But this question cannot be answered unless we bear in mind some standards of "correction" defined in terms of principles that should be preserved, problems that should be solved, etc. The six desiderata listed above provide a rough outline of the normative background used by Field in order to compare different logics and single out the best ones. Obviously, if two theories share the same goals and normative standards, any comparison between them will proceed by assessing their respective success in achieving those goals. However, when two theories pursue different goals and pay attention to different normative standards, things become more complicated.

Field has extensively argued elsewhere[5] that truth is merely a logical device of quantification. That is, partly, why the question he addresses in STFP is: what is the best way to keep IP and TS unrestricted while avoiding semantic paradoxes and damaging ordinary reasoning as little as possible? His deflationary views about truth therefore play a prominent role in the constraints he places on any acceptable logic: insofar as the logical function carried out by the truth predicate crucially depends on IP, preserving IP intact becomes a non-negotiable goal. Of course, for many defenders of substantial theories of truth, IP and TS are negotiable (and not necessarily because they are "logical dogmatists"). But even if we assume a deflationary view of truth, the previous question does not seem to cover all the demands we place on an acceptable solution to the Liar Paradox.

As Charles Chihara once stressed, paradoxes raise issues of two kinds. Some of them concern what he calls the preventative problem: that of finding a solution to the paradox, whereas others concern the diagnostic problem: "the problem of pinpointing that which is deceiving us and, if possible, to explain how and why the deception was produced".[6] Two relevant criteria for assessing the merits of a solution to a paradox are: (i) whether it offers a correct diagnosis of the problem posed by the paradox; and (ii) whether the solution is adequate given the diagnosis. Russell’s principle of vicious circularity, Kripke’s notion of groundedness, Gupta and Belnap’s theory of circular concepts or Priest’s appeal to dialetheias and the Inclosure Scheme are attempts to solve the diagnostic problem. Trying to solve this problem may also show that certain tools employed in the construction of a semantic framework are not philosophically irrelevant. For instance, Gupta claims that the use of revision rules is linked to our understanding of circular concepts and the fact that truth is a circular concept is part of his diagnosis of the problems underlying the Liar Paradox. If the diagnosis is correct, the use of a revision rule in giving the meaning of truth is forced upon us, explaining the failure of some truth principles (such as TS). A correct answer to the diagnostic problem requires us to explain why certain concepts, rules of inference or principles (and not others) are relevant for us to understand the formation of the paradox. Preserving consistency by just rejecting some concepts, rules or principles would block the paradox, but it would not explain why we felt compelled to accept its conclusion in the first place.

Now, the only problem posed by paradoxes that Field seems to address in STFP is that certain logical rules and principles are jointly inconsistent with IP and TS. As long as we preserve these principles, any solution that rejects some rules of inference or principles while only minimally damaging ordinary reasoning would be an acceptable solution to the paradoxes.[7] Notice that different solutions to the paradoxes could meet this requirement and that they could do so without advancing a diagnosis of what is wrong with the paradoxes (or, in other words, of why certain solutions should be preferred to other, similar solutions).

Unfortunately, many of the topics discussed in the book could not find a place in this review. Chief among them are: the application of Field’s paracomplete theory to the solution of the Sorites Paradox; the detailed examination of several different theories of truth in the second part of the book; the comparison between the paracomplete and the dialetheist solutions to the paradoxes; and the philosophical discussion of the notions of agreement and indeterminacy. The book is a valuable source of inspiration on all those topics. It will certainly shape the discussion on semantic paradoxes in the years to come.

[1] It is possible to start with a different valuation as long as it is "transparent", i.e., as long as it respects IP in the context of conditional sentences.

[2] In the book, the construction is carried out for arbitrary formulas. In order to simplify matters we will only consider sentences and skip reference to variable assignments.

[3] The values of the algebraic semantics are based on the revision process itself. Therefore, the algebraic semantics does not simplify the search for the ultimate value of a sentence, since the application of the algebraic semantics requires the previous construction of the revision process.

[4] Since the semantics satisfies IP, defectiveness cannot be expressed by ¬ T<A> & ¬ T<¬A>, this being equivalent to the contradiction ¬ A & ¬ ¬ A.

[5] See Truth and the Absence of Fact, Oxford University Press, 2001.

[6] "The Semantic Paradoxes: A Diagnostic Investigation", Philosophical Review 88: 590-618, 1979, p. 590.

[7] In general, Field does not seem to ascribe any particular philosophical relevance to the choosing of one semantics or another in order to create the theory of truth. For instance, Field would not object to someone's giving a semantics for the conditional by means of fixed points or by means of technical tools other than revision rules, as long as they could create a logic that satisfies as many intuitively acceptable rules as Field's semantics does.