Scepticism and Perceptual Justification

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Dylan Dodd and Elia Zardini (eds.), Scepticism and Perceptual Justification, Oxford University Press, 2014, 363pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199658343.

Reviewed by Kelly Becker, University of New Mexico


This is a volume of excellent new essays whose arguments and ideas were test-run at events organized by the Basis Knowledge Project, housed primarily at St. Andrews, and whose Principal Investigator was Crispin Wright.

One can orient oneself to the action that animates this book by reflecting on possible responses to Moore's "Proof of an External World." (1) Here are two hands. (2) If hands exist, then there is an external world. (3) Therefore, there is an external world (and thus I'm not subject to a massive deception).

Mooreanism is the position that the proof is sound, that its presenter knows that it's sound -- that it is valid and has true premises -- and that thereby its presenter can gain justification for (3) via inference from (1) and (2). (I am construing 'justified' very broadly throughout to include non-inferential warrants and entitlements.) Dogmatism is the liberal view that one can be justified in believing (1) without antecedent justification for (3). Dogmatism does not imply Mooreanism, because on one of its versions one can be justified in believing and know that (1), know that (2), recognize that these together entail (3), but deny either (a) that drawing the inference puts one in position to know the conclusion or (b) that the inference transmits justification to the conclusion. Conservatism is the view that one is justified in believing (1) only if one is antecedently justified in believing (3). The skeptic agrees that the proof is valid, but denies that one can know that one is not massively deceived, hence denies that one knows (1).

After the editors' introduction, the book opens with a prelude by Ernest Sosa, "Descartes's Epistemology." Sosa continues his investigation of the prospects for making virtue of the vice historically associated with the Cartesian Circle, eliciting a parallel between the distinction in contemporary virtue philosophy between animal and reflective knowledge (for which Sosa himself deserves much credit) and Descartes's distinction between cognitio and scientia. The first step is to argue that one need only withhold reflective endorsement from, rather than abandon, one's unreflectively held beliefs, taken as a whole and "under a certain description, perhaps simply as 'beliefs that I have stored in the normal human way'" (23). Second, taken individually, some of these basic beliefs are such that one can only assent to them "because that is what a properly constituted mind must do" (23). These can be the basis for performing reflective scrutiny on one's sources of belief, thus allowing for the possibility of elevating the epistemic status of one's ultimately reflectively held beliefs, including the originally basic ones.

Part I is devoted to the immediacy of perceptual justification, where the main topic is dogmatism , according to which perception can justify perceptual beliefs without independent justification for the reliability of perception. If dogmatism is true, a further question is whether Moorean arguments can provide newly acquired justification for their conclusions (Mooreanism), e.g., that I am not a BIV.

Elia Zardini ("Confirming the Less Likely, Discovering the Unknown") defends Mooreanism and dogmatism by developing a probabilistic representation of justification that accounts for well-known Bayesian objections to each. The objection to Mooreanism is that, upon perceptual experience, for example, as of a cube, one's probability (degree of support) for the proposition that there is no global deceit that makes it look as though there's a cube though there is no cube (NO DECEIT) goes down. The objection to dogmatism is that one's probability for the proposition that there is a cube (CUBE), upon having a cube experience, can never be higher than one's prior probability for NO DECEIT. So if having a cube experience justifies one in believing CUBE, it would seem that one should be antecedently justified in believing NO DECEIT, whereas dogmatism says that perceptual experience can justify perceptual belief without antecedent justification for believing NO DECEIT. Warning: A neck-deep commitment to formal methods and free use of expansive footnotes make this paper tough sledding.

Brian Weatherson ("Probability and Scepticism") considers the Humean skeptical argument that one cannot know "If E, then H," where E is one's evidence and H is some perhaps quite ordinary hypothesis one infers from E. He defends the premise that one cannot know "If E, then H" a posteriori (the other premise being that one cannot know it a priori, the denial of which he deems a feasible anti-skeptical strategy). Part of that defense requires responding to the objection to Mooreanism mentioned above. Unlike Zardini, Weatherson rejects the counterexamples that ground the objection, denying some of them by appeal to the interest-relativity of belief, and thus defends the intuitively plausible principle that learning (obtaining evidence that E) does not lower one's credence in H.

In "E & ¬H," Jonathan Vogel defends the idea that evidence can justify one's belief that one's evidence is not misleading (that ¬(E & ¬H)) and rejects the claim that one can know that ¬(E & ¬H) a priori. Based on considerations from theory choice, Vogel defends Mooreanism while rejecting two principles that stand in its way: that if X entails Y, then Y does not justify ¬X; and that Y justifies X only if Y confirms X.

José Zalabardo ("Inference and Scepticism") is a dogmatist who rejects Mooreanism on roughly Nozickean grounds. Whereas Nozick famously denied that knowledge is closed under known entailment, here Zalabardo argues that Moorean inferences do not transmit inferential justification to their conclusions. He defends the principle PI: "S can have inferential knowledge of H based on the evidence provided by E only if S's belief in E confirms H," where "E confirms hypothesis H just in case the probability of E given H is higher than the probability of E given ~H" (112).

In "Perceptual Knowledge and Background Beliefs," Alan Millar defends a version of dogmatism that hinges on disjunctivism about perceptual knowledge based on recognitional capacities: "in good cases there is a reason to believe that is constituted by truths as to what we perceive to be so and that is not available in corresponding bad cases" (135). Acquiring the recognitional capacity is not based on some antecedent understanding of a covering generalization linking appearances to kinds. Rather, Millar holds that the reverse is true: "It is our acquisition of the recognitional ability that accounts for our acceptance, and even our grasp, of the covering generalization" (142).

Susanna Siegel and Nicholas Silins defend what they call the Attention Optional view, according to which one can have consciousness outside of attention, which in turn can provide justification for belief ("Consciousness, Attention, and Justification"). A key question is whether a distracted, inattentive subject has reason to believe, e.g., that a ball is in front of her. Siegel and Silins focus on propositional rather than doxastic justification, since one may have a reason without knowing it. In footnote 11, they suggest that the Attention Optional view is compatible with dogmatism, but take no stand on the latter. They finish by reflecting on implications of their view for the internalism/externalism debate in epistemology. The cases they discuss are of states that are mental, conscious, and accessible, hence paradigms of internal states, but because they are outside of one's attention, they provide justification that might better fit the externalist model.

The pace quickens in Part II, which focuses on conservatism, and in particular on views espoused by Crispin Wright. Aidan McGlynn ("On Epistemic Alchemy") explores the potential problem of alchemy for conservatives, according to whom one is justified in believing ordinary empirical propositions (e.g., that I have hands) only if one has antecedent justification for its presuppositions (e.g., that I am not subject to massive deception). The problem is that, for Wright, the only plausible justification for believing the latter is a kind of default warrant -- an entitlement to believe. But if justification is closed under known entailment, then one's substantive empirical warrant for an ordinary proposition can "upgrade" the default entitlement to a substantive, earned justification -- alchemy. McGlynn explains the high costs of rejecting specific closure principles, clearing a path to explore the prospects for alchemy.

Duncan Pritchard ("Entitlement and the Groundlessness of Our Believing") takes another critical look at Wright's notion of entitlement. One is entitled to believe that p (e.g., that there is an external world) if commitment to p is unavoidable in order to take on any empirical investigation, and if one has no reason to believe not-p. Clearly, such entitlements do not provide a rational basis for belief, but Wright claims that the entitlement allows for "rational trust" in a presupposition and is therefore genuinely epistemic. Pritchard takes up the interesting question of whether rational trust is a kind of attitude compatible with knowing, and he argues that it is not because it does not exclude agnosticism toward the target proposition. Offering a different interpretation of the most basic and general ("über")-Wittgensteinian hinge propositions -- those we're entitled to believe through rational trust -- than Wright's, Pritchard recasts the conservative's entitlement strategy. Rather than thinking of presupposed hinge propositions as ones we're entitled to believe, and then facing the problem of whether entitlement can overcome agnosticism, Pritchard proposes that our commitments to hinge propositions are not beliefs at all. They are "necessarily immune to rational considerations" (208). In the bargain, we needn't abandon any plausible closure principles, precisely because the inferred über presuppositions are not beliefs.

In "On Epistemic Entitlement (II): Welfare State Epistemology," Crispin Wright shifts attention from having warrants to rationally claiming them. Thinking of entitlements to trust hinge propositions as epistemic rights on analogy with moral rights, one can have them without knowing it, but can also claim them "in perfectly good order" (222). In response to the problem of alchemy, Wright sketches a model where one can attain new evidence for an ordinary proposition, which then provides further evidential warrant for hinges (hence alchemy), but still does not improve one's epistemic stance with respect to the hinge. Wright then goes on to address Pritchard's concerns that the rational trust in hinges provided by basic entitlements is not genuinely epistemic, as opposed, say, to pragmatic, that is, practically required to pursue one's epistemic ends. Wright claims that, precisely because entitlements serve epistemic ends and values, they provide epistemic reasons.

Annalisa Coliva ("Moderatism, Transmission Failures, Closure, and Humean Scepticism") is dubious about whether Wright's characterization of entitlements makes them genuinely epistemic, since "they aren't meant to speak to the likely truth of what should be warranted thereby" (268), such as that there is an external world. Coliva suggests a "moderate" view, where a basic perceptual belief is justified by perceptual experience only if one assumes the relevant hinge presuppositions, but the latter are neither antecedently warranted nor warranted by inference by known entailment from basic beliefs.

Part III focuses on 'asymmetrism', a position accepted by disjunctivists. Asymmetrists claim that one's justification in veridical perception is better than when misperceiving. In the former case, one is in direct perceptual contact with the world, whereas in the latter, well, not. Asymmetrists endorse Mooreanism insofar as, in the good cases, one knows ordinary empirical facts (e.g., Here are two hands) without independent justification for background assumptions (e.g., There is an external world), and can come to know the latter on the basis of the former. However, asymmetrists are not traditional dogmatists, since they do not accept the claim that one's justificatory status can be the same in veridical and non-veridical perception.

Alex Byrne ("McDowell and Wright on Anti-Scepticism, etc.") defends McDowellian disjunctivism (though not McDowell's view in full) against criticisms from Crispin Wright. McDowell rejects the idea that veridical perception and illusory perception provide similar justification for believing that such-and-so is the case, a standard premise en route to skepticism. Instead, in veridical perception, the facts are directly open to the mind. Targeting the inferential model of perceptual justification, Byrne appeals to cases of basic, non-inferential perceptual knowledge in children and animals to support direct perception. Then, noting that the skeptic's position does not require inferentialism per se, Byrne argues against the more fundamental skeptical premise that one's perceptual evidence for a putatively singular (object-dependent) proposition is the same in veridical and non-veridical cases. This opens up the possibility that in good cases one knows that p not through experiential evidence that is neutral in good and bad cases, but through directly perceiving the fact that p.

In "What Is My Evidence that Here Is a Hand?", Roger White offers arguments to support the "Cartesian Picture," according to which "What attitudes I'm justified in taking to P . . . remain exactly the same in both the Good and the Bad cases, for my basic evidence remains the same" (302). (This is "the more fundamental skeptical premise" that I just mentioned.) White entertainingly describes a series of scenarios where in a bad case we judge the subject no less rational, certain, or justified in believing than in a good case, whereas the asymmetry view appears committed to the opposite verdict. He then describes other cases (one of them gruesome) to probe and critique possible asymmetrist approaches to defeaters.

Drawing on arguments from John Pollock and Keith Lehrer, Martin Smith ("The Arbitrariness of Belief") argues that parity reasoning -- of the sort John Hawthorne uses to show that it is arbitrary to believe, of any given lottery ticket, that it will lose -- can be generalized to show that it is arbitrary to believe any proposition that is less than certain. Smith then argues that attempting to avoid the obvious skeptical upshot by appeal to the idea that justification implies certainty, and that certainty is obtainable (as in the good cases on an asymmetrist view), has negative consequences of its own.

The book opens with an introduction by the editors, and closes with a piece by Dylan Dodd ("How to Motivate Skepticism"). The introduction is very helpful but sometimes reads like an advertisement -- lots of words and phrases italicized for no obvious reason (I'd wondered whether there would be a quiz at the end), and a claim that the book has "a unique added historical value" in that it is based on material presented for the Basic Knowledge Project. I don't intend these remarks all that critically; rather, I found these features merely eyebrow-raising.

Dodd's paper is focused on the following question: Even if all of one's perceptual evidence is compatible with skeptical possibilities, why should that imply that the evidence does not justify basic beliefs, for example that I have hands? Dodd looks at likely candidates for motivating skepticism from Bayesian confirmation theory and finds them unsatisfactory. He then argues that 'Mushy Bayesianism' -- the view that "a rational subject's doxastic state is represented by a family of probability functions" (345) as opposed to a single probability function -- provides a better motivation for skepticism.

Taking the easy way out, I won't offer criticism of any of the positions staked in the book. At this astonishingly highly developed stage of the inquiry, short of delivering a full-scale essay, any criticism would likely come off either as merely choosing up sides or as picking nits. I will, however, make a few general remarks. First, given that the book is so sharply focused, it is rather easy to dive into each paper, knowing in advance that while it will take a recognizable stand on Moore's Proof, it will suggest further epistemological implications worthy of sustained reflection. (Beware, however, that there is quite a bit of formal epistemology on display in some of the papers, one in particular that I've already noted.) Second, the volume is clearly state of the art. While many will deem this a good thing, not everyone will. Analytic philosophy is at its best when it explores and illuminates interstices made visible through creative approaches to long-standing problems. The danger is that, when, in the fullness of time, a simple argument like Moore's Proof is subject to myriad critical analyses and relentless "drilling down," one can forget what it would even take for one of them to be a better candidate for the truth than another. But anyway, third, let us end on an up beat. Another way to approach this book is to think of Moore's Proof as a common reference point for investigating, exploring, and articulating a host of important epistemological concepts and methods. Many of our questions are old, but keeping them alive expands and enriches understanding.