Scepticism Comes Alive

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Bryan Frances, Scepticism Comes Alive, Oxford University Press, 2005, 224pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199282137.

Reviewed by Baron Reed, Northern Illinois University


What do you do when your beliefs conflict with what an expert says? The expert has all of the same evidence as you -- and a lot more, too -- and has thought about it longer and harder than you. In every way, the expert is in a better position to know the truth. It would be presumptuous to hold onto your initial belief when challenged by the expert. Even if you did stick with your belief, and even if your belief turned out to be right -- and the expert somehow wrong -- it wouldn't be enough. Your belief wouldn't be justified (or warranted) enough to be knowledge.

This is the basic idea underlying live skepticism, the view that Bryan Frances develops at length in his insightful and engaging new book. In form, live skepticism appears similar to a familiar argument for traditional skepticism. The traditional skeptic argues: in order to know some P (say, that I have hands), I have to be able to rule out possibilities incompatible with the truth of P; the usual skeptical scenarios (e.g., the evil-demon hypothesis) are possibilities incompatible with my knowing P; I can't rule them out; so, I do not know P. The live skeptic's reasoning follows the same general pattern, except that different incompatible possibilities are inserted into the argument. Here is one example: in order to know some P (say, that the sky is blue), I have to be able to rule out possibilities incompatible with the truth of P; color error theory is incompatible with the truth of P; I can't rule out color error theory; so, I don't know P. The difference between traditional skepticism and Frances' live skepticism is important. Some of the most influential responses to traditional skepticism -- e.g., the relevant alternatives approach and attributor-contextualism -- have focused on the implausibility of the usual skeptical scenarios. No one really thinks there is an evil demon, so why worry about it? But some people -- very smart people -- think that color error theory is true, so that is something to worry about.

A bit of conceptual apparatus allows for a more formal presentation of the live skeptic's argument. Frances says that a hypothesis H is live for an intellectual community when it satisfies the following five conditions (pp. 18-9):

H has been through a significant evaluation in the community by experts over many years.

H is judged actually true or as likely to be true as any relevant possibility by a significant number of experts.

The judgment of those experts has been reached in an epistemically responsible way.

Those experts consider there to be several independent sources of evidence for H.

Many of those experts consider H to be a live possibility.

A subject S is a mere mortal with respect to H just in case (pp. 19-20):

S is as aware as anyone that H is inconsistent with P.

S's intelligence, understanding, and knowledge with respect to H are not extraordinary for S's community.

S is at least somewhat familiar with H, including the fact that H is live.

S's reasons for rejecting H would be universally considered insufficient to rule it out.

Given these two concepts, a general template for the live skeptic's argument can be presented as follows, where H is a live hypothesis and P is a proposition that cannot be true if H is (pp. 24-5):

The Modesty Principle. If S is mortal with respect to H, then H isn't ruled out for S.

The Live Hypothesis Principle. If H isn't ruled out for S, then S doesn't know P.

Therefore, if S is mortal with respect to H, S doesn't know P.

The Mere Mortal Premise. In the actual world or in a close possible world, many philosophers and scientists are mere mortals regarding H.

Therefore, many philosophers and scientists don't know P.

Different versions of the argument can then be derived by substituting different live philosophical or scientific hypotheses in the template. Some of the theories Frances finds suitable for live skeptical arguments include, in addition to color error theory, eliminativism and the view that there are no character traits (p. 71).

Live skepticism differs from traditional skepticism in some interesting ways. First, the traditional skeptic usually targets broad categories of belief -- say, beliefs about the external world or beliefs about the past. By contrast, the live skeptic's targets are more limited. If I am a mere mortal with respect to color error theory, I will not know that the sky is blue, but I will still know that the sky exists, that the atmosphere is mostly nitrogen and oxygen, etc. If I am a mere mortal with respect to eliminativism, I will not know that I believe that it is raining, but I will still know that it is raining, that I act as though I believe it is raining, etc.

Second, traditional skepticism is thought to pose an ineliminable problem, if it is correct. Just as there is nothing the victim of an evil demon can do to free herself of the demon's deceptions, so there is nothing we non-victims can do to prove that we are not being deceived by the demon. But this is not how live skepticism works. If I do not know that the sky is blue because I cannot rule out color error theory, there is something I can do to improve my situation: I can do some research and acquire better reasons for thinking that color error theory is false.

Third, and perhaps most peculiar of all, a subject who satisfies the conditions for live skepticism is, in some ways, better off epistemically than most subjects who don't. One of the conditions for S being a mere mortal with respect to a live hypothesis H is that S be at least somewhat familiar with H. Thus, for example, Mary -- an average graduate student in philosophy -- is acquainted with color error theory, but her six-year-old niece, Nancy, is not. So, Mary does not know that the sky is blue, but Nancy does. Still, Mary's epistemic situation with respect to color is better than Nancy's, in that Mary has a broader understanding of the scientific and philosophical issues surrounding the nature of color. To borrow a phrase from Carl Ginet, Mary is in a position of knowing less by knowing more.

Frances does an admirable job of defending live skepticism against a wide range of objections, including responses adapted from both contextualism and the Moorean response to traditional skepticism. However well those views may handle traditional skepticism, Frances makes a compelling case for the claim that they do not touch live skepticism. He also succeeds in presenting skepticism -- both live and traditional -- from an illuminating perspective, from which it becomes clear that present-day epistemology has developed in a way quite different from other philosophical disciplines. Error theories are respectable options in metaphysics (a good example, again, being color error theory), philosophy of mind (eliminitivism), and ethics. But skepticism, which is essentially an error theory with respect to knowledge, is very often stigmatized as beyond the pale. No one is -- or, more strongly -- could be a skeptic, the argument goes, so the view does not really need to be refuted. To his credit, Frances resists this approach -- and even develops, rather plausibly, what he calls the skeptical solution to the puzzle generated by the live skeptical argument -- though it seems he would not consider himself to be a skeptic.

I turn now to a closer examination of the argument structure for live skepticism. It is not immediately obvious why a live hypothesis H is relevant to a particular belief P held by subject S. One natural suggestion is that H presents an alternative possibility that must be ruled out in order to know P. But this cannot be the whole story, for Frances requires not only that H be judged by the experts to be a live hypothesis, but also that S be aware of it as such and as inconsistent with some of her beliefs. Moreover, Frances says that "We have an epistemic responsibility to the live hypotheses in our intellectual community competing with our own beliefs" (47). H works by providing "negative warrant sufficient to offset or cancel or 'veto' the positive warrant" P may possess (84). This suggests, then, that H serves as a defeater for S's belief P, where a defeater functions in an externalist epistemology (like that of Alvin Goldman or Alvin Plantinga) as a way of capturing the epistemic importance of subjective rationality. (To be precise, the suggestion is that H is a defeater that has not itself been defeated.) Suppose that S's belief P has been reliably formed; even so, if S possesses counterevidence for the belief, it is irrational for S to continue holding it. This irrationality is incompatible with S's knowing P; thus, the counterevidence defeats S's warrant or justification for P.

Although this understanding of how a live hypothesis is epistemically relevant seems to fit well with the way Frances conceives of them, it is not clear that live hypotheses really are well-suited to be defeaters. As they are usually characterized, defeaters are either beliefs that the subject actually has or beliefs that she ought to have. But neither seems to be the case for the live hypotheses that Frances uses. Frances intends the live skeptical argument to apply broadly -- not just to those who actually believe that the live hypotheses are true, but to those who are aware that at least some experts regard them as true. So, the live hypotheses will generally not be defeaters in the first sense. And even though some experts regard them as true, many other experts do not, so it does not look as though subjects ought to believe that the live hypotheses are true. Thus, the live hypotheses are not typically defeaters in the second sense, either.

Neither of the two usual characterizations of defeaters works for Frances' purposes. The only remaining possibility is that the live hypotheses serve as defeaters because they introduce doubts that the subject ought to have. Thus, even though S should not believe that color error theory is true, she ought to doubt that the sky is blue given her recognition of the theory's liveness. But if this is what Frances has in mind, further argument is needed. The opponent of live skepticism will simply deny that the judgment of some experts should count for so much when it is opposed by the judgment of other experts. Absent some deeper reason to accord so much weight to experts who disagree with S, we are at an impasse.

Frances does provide such an argument, which we may regard as an attempt to link the judgment of experts with whom one disagrees to one's subjective irrationality. Suppose that you are a mere mortal regarding some H incompatible with your belief P. You don't accept H but rather think one of its rivals, H*, is correct, where H* is compatible with the truth of P. Nevertheless, even if your belief P is true and well justified, Frances says that it is not knowledge since "you could just as easily have gone to a school populated with teachers who subscribe" to H rather than H* (13-4). The idea seems to be, then, that you are in something like a Gettier case: your belief P is accidentally true (or, perhaps better: accidentally justified) because you could easily have formed a belief, H, that conflicts with P and thus would serve as a defeater, in the first sense mentioned above, for P. Although your belief P is in fact true and justified, this is so only because you were lucky enough to study with the H* proponents.

There are a couple of problems with this argument. First, this sort of situation is really not very common at all. Students rarely accept a theory just because their mentors do. The opposite is actually more likely to happen -- students choose their mentors based on what views they hold. So, even if you had studied with the world's leading proponent of H, it is far from clear that you would have ended up accepting H yourself. Second, the live hypothesis that Frances regards as most potent for the live skeptic, eliminativism, is not very widely held these days. In fact, as Frances recognizes, eliminativism probably does not even meet condition (ii) for being a live hypothesis. Still, he argues, "there could quite easily be a society just like ours where eliminativism is false but a live view in philosophy and cognitive science" (42). We are "on an epistemic par" with the people in that society, so if they have skeptical problems grounded in eliminativism, so do we (43-4). But it is hard to see how we could be in the same epistemic position as the people in the live-eliminativism society. Given all the experts they confront who defend eliminativism, it is inevitable that they would be in possession of a body of evidence significantly different from our own.

The upshot of these considerations is that more work needs to be done to establish the epistemic relevance of live hypotheses to those subjects who reject them but acknowledge their liveness. There is also a deeper problem with the argument structure used by the live skeptic. Condition (d) of being a mere mortal says that one's reasons for rejecting H would be considered insufficient by the experts to rule out H. But what does it mean to rule out a hypothesis? According to the Mere Mortal Premise of the argument template, many philosophers and scientists are mere mortals for the sorts of hypotheses the live skeptic uses. This is true even though many philosophers who specialize in, say, ethics will have at least a passing acquaintance with the issues surrounding color error theory or eliminativism. So, ruling out a hypothesis must require a fairly high grade of epistemic competence. This is consistent with the way Frances characterizes being a mere mortal. He glosses condition (d) in the following way. Suppose you are a Ph.D. candidate writing a thesis on a matter that touches tangentially on H. You present your advisor with a brief section in which you reject H, and "she tells you flat out that what you've said is clearly inadequate and you should either do much better with a critical section or drop it entirely and say in a footnote that you'll merely be assuming the falsehood" of H (21).

Now, in this situation it is clear that your advisor takes your basis for ruling out H to be insufficient for you to count as an expert on H. But it is not clear that your advisor would take your basis for ruling out H to be insufficient when what is at stake is merely knowledge of some propositions incompatible with the truth of H. When it is merely knowledge that is at issue, and not expertise, condition (d) becomes much easier to satisfy. Indeed, most experts would be inclined to think that their own testimony to you that H is incorrect would be enough all by itself for you to know that H is false.

To put the point another way, it is plausible to hold that S has ruled out H when S knows that H is false. But just about every epistemologist now is a fallibilist. If fallibilism is correct, knowing that H is false is not overly difficult. In general, we think that testimony from a recognized expert on the matter is sufficient for one to acquire knowledge. If this is right, then almost no one is a mere mortal with respect to the live hypotheses. The live skeptic's arguments will apply only to those who have learned about the live hypotheses but have not yet formed even an implicit judgment as to whether they are true. Given the fact that we are naturally inclined to disbelieve hypotheses like eliminativism and color error theory, there will be very few subjects affected by the argument for live skepticism.

Whether or not these are significant problems for the live skeptic's argument, Frances' book opens up interesting new territory for fruitful debate. It is also a fun book to read -- Frances' writing is both modest and witty -- and one that is well worth reading, even for those who fail to be convinced that live skepticism is a significant problem.