Schelling's Practice of the Wild: Time, Art, Imagination

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Jason M. Wirth, Schelling's Practice of the Wild: Time, Art, Imagination, SUNY Press, 2015, 280pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438456799.

Reviewed by Patrick Burke, Gonzaga in Florence


The title of this book is inspired in part by the American poet Gary Snyder who, in his work entitled The Practice of the Wild, writes in a truly Schellingian voice that in both lovemaking and art there is a "bonding of the wild in ourselves to the (wild) process of the universe" (125). Jason M. Wirth describes Schelling's practice of the wild as "thinking and dwelling with and on the sovereign autogenesis of nature" (23). In the manner of Meister Eckhart, the practice of the wild is the practice of gelassenheit. It is a surrendering of self to the creative process of nature, to its genetic temporality, by letting the ground of nature operate freely. It is "what Zen called the Great Death, the dying to oneself in the coming to life as love" (48). Creativity is not some subjective factor but is the mysterious life of nature expressing itself as life, the animating force of which is time. Across all six chapters, Wirth argues that the wonderful strangeness of nature calls for the practice of the profoundest love, calls for the practice of the wild.

The wild is described as imagination, and it is at the heart of all images. Citing John Sallis, Wirth claims that the wild is 'monstrous,' not as an aberration but as that which trespasses the limits of mere explication (26). And here Wirth announces the purpose of his work: to liberate the imagination, die Einbildungskraft, from the fantasy that it is a faculty of representation (153) and, consequently, to take up the perplexing question of what is an image or Bild. Contrary to the Platonic tradition still embedded in modern discourse, he will argue that the imagination is the font of all thinking and the principle of creativity that is formative of the very opening upon things. He will present the image as a 'revelation' without representation. Wirth sees the problem of the image and imagination as a contemporary problem and, rather than merely reporting what Schelling says, purports to think through this problem with Schelling in a mutual practice of the wild, thereby rendering Schelling our contemporary, a project that, in my judgment, is utterly prodigious. He interfaces the thought of Schelling with some of the major figures of contemporary continental philosophy, principally Deleuze but also Heidegger, Derrida, Nancy, Sallis and others, as well as recent Schelling scholars such as Bruce Matthews and Lore Hühn. Writers of literature are also present and decisive, especially Melville but also Flaubert, Musil, Kundera, Coleridge, Hölderlin, and others. Clearly master of more than one book or tradition, Wirth thinks through this problem also with the Eastern traditions, principally that of Mahāyāna Buddism and Taoism. Much like that of Schelling, Wirth's thinking in this book is expansive, original, rich, and daring enough that it renders quite difficult a limited review.

Following the later Schelling, Wirth divides Schelling's philosophical itinerary into two periods, that of negative philosophy (the Naturphilosophie and earlier) and that of positive philosophy whose themes were foreshadowed in the Ages of the World (1815) and the Freedom essay (1809) and developed in the later works on revelation and mythology (the Berlin lectures, 1842-43). He sees the task of negative philosophy as overcoming the alienation of nature found in modern philosophy by intuiting "the infinite within the finite and . . . the ungrounded ground from which thinking arises" (118) while pointing out that it cannot account for the sovereign life of imagination, natura naturans. Positive philosophy displaces pure reason in favor of the cognition of actual experience and denies that the ungrounded ground is simply an abstraction (223). It provides a careful genealogy of past experience and a vigorous discernment of the present, and affirms the coming into the finite of the infinite as something found in the creativity of inspired living art.

Granting that philosophy always has an analytical task, Wirth nonetheless argues that, more importantly, it must cultivate the largesse and creativity that the imagination unleashes in the form of revelation and its poetic expression in mythology. In fact, in his second chapter on the "Solitude of God," he makes claims that may be taken as audacious and scandalous, namely that revelation is the ground for the possibility of philosophy, that it belongs first to philosophy more than it does to religion and is, in fact, first philosophy, "naming the very revelatory force of revelation itself" (32), a force that Wirth will call the monstrous solitude of God. Following Schelling, he announces a prophetic philosophical and ecologically responsive religion. He goes on to make what many traditional theologians and Schelling scholars would think is an outrageous claim, namely that prophesy points to Foucault's new age of curiosity. (39)

In practicing the wild with and through Schelling, Wirth addresses a range of contemporary themes such as radical evil, the ecological crisis, stupidity, and the meaning of philosophy as well as problems that dogged Schelling's thought as early as Eschenmeyer's and Hegel's critiques, principally the issue of the emergence of differentiation (duality) from absolute identity. One of the virtues of this book is that Wirth includes the first English translation of Schelling's response to Eschenmeyer on this issue as well as on other critical claims such as anthropomorphism and the conflating of the logical relation of antecedent and consequent with the real relation of cause and effect. Included also is a fine critical essay by Christopher Lauer, who translated this work with Wirth.

Although the declared focus of the book is the problem of the imagination and its relation to time, there is an undercurrent of discourse dedicated to the problem of the creative differentiation of nature, of the primordial chaotic ground prior to any duality that Schelling, following Jacob Boehme, names the Urgrund or Ungrund and what Wirth interprets as the barbarian principle with its infinite fecundity (37). In his third chapter on the "Image of Thought", Wirth praises Deleuze who, in contradistinction to Hegel, claims that "it is Schelling who brings difference out of the night of the Identical" (62), and yet Wirth regrets that Deleuze, who also claims that groundlessness swarms with differences (109), maintains nonetheless that Schelling's Ungrund cannot sustain difference (223).

In response to this criticism, Wirth offers his reading of the solitude of God, embedded within which is a differential calculus, "a calculus that does not repress difference, but rather releases the differential temporality and spatiality of the potencies" (66). He employs two images as metaphors to discuss the solitude of God, namely fire and water. Following the Mahāyāna tradition, fire is the emptiness of form, of being, and yet is the unity of two dynamic interdependent opposing forces, fundamentally the unity of the opposition of difference and identity (33). Water has no form of its own yet is capable of taking on any form. In the Mahāyāna tradition, water, like fire, is also the emptiness of form. In this book replete with ocean images, Wirth claims that water is "not the principle of plurality but the plurality itself as principle" (145). Like fire, it is an Urbild, an 'elemental image,' i.e., an unimaginable and unrepresentable source of images (152). Following Boehme and Schelling, Wirth asserts that the solitude of the Ungrund as a principle is antecedent to its differential expression as both the ground of God's existence and God's existence itself but remains immanent in God as existent as it does in all things in their radical singularity. And he adds that the oneness of solitude should not be confused with mathematical individuality as it is prior to all number, it is the ONE of difference itself, having no form of its own but, as symbolized by the image of water, can take on any form.

Turning to other issues, Wirth describes radical evil as abandoning the ground or living center from which everything flows in favor of living at the periphery, as if it were the wellspring of life, leaving the person alone in the delusion of his or her ipseity (10). Radical evil is failed love that contests the will of the ground with the consequent undermining of the very image of oneself. At the end of his last chapter, Wirth presents Melville's Ahab as the monstrous quintessential expression of an extra-human monomania, of a self-destructive solipsism that shatters the world. This theme is pivotal to his first chapter on "Extinction" where Wirth with and through Schelling takes up the current ecological crisis, pointing to the self-destructive self-assertion of the self-absorbed human leading to the immanent wreckage of the earth, a kind of nature-cide (6) evident in the catastrophic ruination of rain forests and the general devastation of non-human habitats.

The radical evil entailed in the sublimating of the originating center to oneself is also found in dogmatic philosophical thinking, all of which Wirth places under the rubric of "stupidity," and he devotes all of chapter four to what he, following Deleuze, considers a transcendental problem expressed in two questions: "how is bétise (stupidity) possible" (xvi) and "how does stupidity expose the violence and madness incipient but repressed within dogmatic thinking" (94)? To address these questions, he takes up in a remarkably poignant fashion Schelling's Freedom essay and its echoes and unfoldings in Deleuze, Derrida, Musil, Flaubert and Nietzsche. In his Munich lectures (1827), Schelling warns that the recourse to the mystical as often found in negative philosophy can keep thinking from becoming aware of its own stupidity. However, avoiding reducing the mystical to ideology's auto-mystification and distraction from the real, positive philosophy must open a new non-dogmatic image of thought that does not detach it from its living ground. It takes up the question of the temporality of the productive imagination as the creative force within art and nature, as the secret of their mutual or co-autogenesis. This is the theme of the last chapter, "Life of Imagination," which Wirth values as the key chapter to his whole book.

Contrary to the two realm doctrine of classical Platonism with its radical bifurcation of the intelligible and sensible, Wirth wants to reclaim the inseparability of the 'sense' of these two dimensions. Works of art, for example, don't point to some super-sensuous realm. Beauty is to be found only in beautiful things, only in the image as an image. It is thus to art that Wirth turns in this last chapter to reveal the monstrous unprethinkable life of imagination and to show that philosophy needs art if it is to cease regarding nature as an object for a self-reflective subject. Philosophy must return both subject and object to the originating center in order to reclaim its own inherent creativity as aesthetic intuition, i.e., as productive intellectual intuition which mirrors the unfolding of nature as source but, as in Zen, from the perspective of the mirror itself, a mirror that does not distort but lets be, letting life shine forth in the beauty of shining as such, as revelation once again without representation, life referring only to itself. Here Wirth distinguishes das Urbild, the primoridial image, from das Gegenbild (155), the counter-image offered by art that reveals the primordial image, reflecting it back onto itself. Following Schelling, the ultimate form of human creativity is mythology from which art is derived and out of which the reflective life, pushed to its limits, is transformed. In mythology we glimpse the primordial world itself. Myth offers an 'elemental image' or symbol as the expression of the ungrounding ground, of the elemental abyss, an Urbild both concrete and universal, but again referring only to itself. The task of the mythology is to integrate more fully he gods of history with the gods of nature.

In this final chapter, Wirth is correct in claiming that "it is not quite right to speak of Schelling's creation as if it were a kind of agency" (167), especially if 'agency' means that predicated of the classical creator God who acts from a realm independent of being. Although this book already presents an excellent reconfiguring and revitalizing of Schelling's philosophy regarding perennial and contemporary issues, I think it would be enhanced if the idea of 'agency' were to be formally developed in the discussion, especially in reference to the Ungrund out of the infinite fecundity of which issues, it would seem, the difference between the ground of God's existence and his personal existence itself, i.e., not as the ground of their identity, but, as Wirth argues, the very possibility of their difference. Certainly he uses the language of agency when he appears to conflate temporality, creativity, auto-genesis, and the wild life of imagination as natura naturans. And all of this makes sense when Schelling speaks of a 'longing', a 'yearning', a desiring, a self-actualizing essential dynamism in the ground of God's existence impelling it toward the personal God of love as discussed in the Freedom essay, and when he conceives the relation between these two in terms as an organic unity of reciprocal implication or reciprocal agency, or 'causality' if you will. Wirth suggests something similar when he speaks of a conversation or dialectic across the dis-equal vital cision or gap (die Scheidung) between the Ungrund and the being of becoming, a gap out of which the world and all individual things come to be (87).

But we would still like to ask whether, as the groundless ground within a living, ever beginning, inexhaustible organic whole, as the most primordial aspect of the Absolute, as the abyss of its being, is the Ungrund the principle of productive temporality, of the genetic temporality, what renders the imagination a force rather than a faculty? Is the yearning characteristic of the ground of God's existence to be found in the groundless ground of that ground, "the dark precursor, the invisible remainder contesting while supporting all beings" (63)? But the reader is told that the Ungrund has no being at all, is a non-being, not as nothingness, but in that it lacks form as does water. If it is the originary unruliness of primary matter, of der Urstoff, if it is primal chaos, how is it that it is fecund, that it can support? Is der Urstoff pregnant with form? Does the wild abyss express itself, does it speak (219)? In other words, and to sum up all of this, is there any spontaneous action or agency in the ontologically prior Ungrund as a principle out of which all things begin? Some explicit discussion of these questions would claim our attention even more, would raise even further our interest in this already well-argued and brilliant text. Given these questions, we must note, however, that Wirth wonders, echoing Deleuze, if the sufficiency of an organic image of thought "may be an insuperable problem" (67).

By thinking with and through Schelling on contemporary issues, Wirth is at the heart of the renaissance underway of Schelling's philosophy. He has been an original contributor to this since his new translation of the Ages of the World. In his magisterial work, Schelling's Practice of the Wild, Wirth brings this renaissance to a greater flowering by taking Schelling's thinking elsewhere, even beyond where it might have gone had it been the beneficiary of a century of criticism. In this respect, Wirth's book advances our philosophical heritage.