Schiller as Philosopher: A Re-Examination

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Frederick Beiser, Schiller as Philosopher: A Re-Examination, Oxford University Press, 2005, 304pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 019928282X.

Reviewed by Robert Wicks, The University of Auckland


In his short novel, Billy Budd, Foretopman (1891), Herman Melville presents the tragedy of a physically strong and attractive young seaman, innocent of heart and worldly experience -- a naïve, beautiful soul, in a sense -- whose capital crime was to lash out instinctively at a malevolent superior officer who had falsely charged him with mutiny. The novel's ensuing and concluding reflections upon the tensions between moral truth and legal necessity approach some of the finest to be found in moral philosophy.

Melville was an outstanding American novelist with acute philosophical insight, but he is not among the leading Western philosophers. Friedrich Schiller, one of Germany's finest poets and playwrights, wrote a small proportion of philosophical letters and essays, and he accordingly remains an ambiguous and confusing figure: academic philosophy professionals usually dismiss him as a philosophical amateur; some intellectuals celebrate him as a first-rate philosophical theoretician.

In Schiller as Philosopher: A Re-Examination, Frederick Beiser asserts that Schiller's philosophical accomplishments are on a par with his dramatic and poetic achievements, and that as a philosopher, Schiller can be fruitfully and favorably compared with writers of Immanuel Kant's stature. To transform the commonly-encountered opinion that Schiller's philosophical writings are too muddled to count as respectable philosophy, and to set the record straight about what Schiller actually maintained, Beiser introduces his book with a list of "myths" about Schiller. The study aims to show that each of the following claims (quoted from pp. 10-12, here reorganized into two thematic clusters) is a misconception:

I. Myths about Schiller's early writings, and about his famous Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Man:

· Schiller was a bitter opponent of all forms of dualism and his chief aim was to surmount dualism with a 'Vereinigungsphilosophie.'

· Schiller's aesthetic education was a flight from the political world.

· Schiller is guilty of aestheticism because he makes beauty into a motive for moral action and a justification of the state.

· Schiller's Ästhetische Briefe is a fatally divided work because it treats the aesthetic as both a means and end.

II. Myths about Schiller's philosophical relationships to Kant and German Idealism:

· Schiller attempts to relax the rigour of Kant's moral principles.

· Schiller defends natural feelings and instincts as motivations for moral action.

· Schiller's dispute with Kant concerns whether feeling and inclination are necessary for the moral worth of actions. Schiller [allegedly] attributes to Kant the view that actions have a moral worth only if they are done contrary to feeling and inclination; he [allegedly] maintains instead that an action has moral worth only insofar as the agent wants to do it.

· Schiller's philosophy was an attempt to fuse the ethics of Kant with those of Shaftesbury.

· Schiller's objective aesthetics anticipates the absolute idealism of Schelling and Hegel.

Before reflecting upon some of the above claims, let us consider Schiller as Philosopher as a whole. The densely-printed, 304-page book divides into eight chapters which address the following subjects: Schiller's early writings and their inspiration from the study of medicine (25 pp.), his quest for an objective principle of beauty, contra Kant, in the Kallias Briefe (30 pp.), his essay "On Grace and Dignity" and the associated concept of the beautiful soul (41 pp.), his On the Aesthetic Education of Man in a Series of Letters (49 pp.), comparisons and contrasts with Kant's moral theory (21 pp.), beauty's aesthetic autonomy as opposed to its moral application (21 pp.), and Schiller's theories of freedom (23 pp.), tragedy and sublimity (24 pp.).

All of this rich material is extremely well-researched. Beiser displays an impeccable familiarity with Schiller's texts and a thoroughgoing fluency in the secondary literature on Schiller in German and English. The exposition is smooth and engaging, it carries a pleasant literary ring, and it also transcends common scholarly opinion at crucial points. The chapter addressing "On Grace and Dignity" is perhaps the most intellectually enjoyable in its multi-aspectedness.

If we juxtapose a pair of quotes from the book's initial pages, however, we can begin to apprehend some shortcomings. The following quotes are located a few pages apart, respectively, in the preface and introduction.

This study is partly thematic and partly textual. It does not attempt to be a complete study of Schiller's philosophy. It limits itself mainly to Schiller's aesthetic writings; and, for reasons of space, it does not examine Schiller's last great essay, Über naïve und sentimentalische Dichtung. It is designed so that each chapter can be read individually. This has made for some repetition. Often the same material has to be set in a different context and seen from a different focus. I hope that those who wish to read the work consecutively do not find the repetition too tedious. (p. viii)

It is generally recognized that one of the most creative periods of aesthetics was that from Baumgarten to Hegel… . Among the crowning achievements of this period are Schiller's aesthetic essays, which were written from 1791 to 1795. Schiller's three major essays -- Anmut und Würde (1793) ["On Grace and Dignity"], Über die ästhetische Erziehung des Menschen in einer Reihe von Briefen (1795) [On the Aesthetic Education of Man in a Series of Letters], and Über naïve und sentimentalische Dichtung (1795) ["On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry"] -- have been regarded as classics. Since their publication over two centuries ago, they have been the subject of intensive discussion and commentary. (p.1)

It should now be evident that the book initially stimulates some puzzlement. The title is Schiller as Philosopher and it concentrates squarely on Schiller's philosophical-aesthetic writings. The goal is to reveal his intellectual stature as a genuine, first-rate philosopher. Schiller wrote three major philosophical essays and within the field of philosophical aesthetics, these three are among the crowning achievements of the period as a whole. Each of the book's chapters is self-contained, so there is some repetition and overlap between the chapters. The book addresses only two out of the three famous philosophical essays, and omits the third owing to lack of space.

The omission of one of Schiller's three most important philosophical essays is disappointing, although the book contains many redeeming scholarly contributions. "On Grace and Dignity" is difficult to locate in English translation, and sections from "On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry" and the Letters are the most anthologized of Schiller's writings within the English-speaking philosophical community. Anyone who teaches Schiller, upon becoming aware of this book, will immediately and eagerly anticipate analyses of the Letters and "On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry." Unfortunately, one quickly realizes that a treatment of the latter will be left out "for reasons of space."

This absence leaves the portrait undone. We are later told, for instance, that in the Letters "Schiller takes a position on the state of nature that is diametrically opposed to Rousseau" and that "the point is worth stressing because Schiller is so often regarded as subscribing to an idealistic conception of man's natural state" (p. 158). As many know, Schiller is often associated with such an idealistic conception, precisely because he states explicitly in "On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry" that:

As long as we were children of nature merely, we enjoyed happiness and perfection; we became free, and lost both. Thence arises a dual and very unequal longing for nature, a longing for her happiness, a longing for her perfection.

It can remain an open question whether Schiller changed his mind between writing the Letters and "On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry," or whether Beiser has overemphasized Schiller's remarks to the contrary, or whether the two positions are somehow consistent. The present point is simply that the lack of a chapter on "On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry" leaves many questions open, and generates the perception that the manuscript was unwisely truncated.

Nonetheless, we have an excellently researched presentation that instructively reveals how ignorance tends still to prevail in certain segments of the history of philosophy. Beiser's forte is to show how certain writers who are virtually unknown today, were once well-known, influential during their time, and essential to appreciate today if we are to understand the philosophical formulations intelligently. Schiller as Philosopher is probably, to date, the most reliable exposition of what Schiller actually said, and it is one of the sharpest displays of how mistaken some hitherto prevailing interpretations of Schiller have been.

The price of such a historically-centered style, one must add, is to produce texts that are predominantly expository and exegetical. Frequently and satisfying enough, however, we are given examples of Schiller's underlying philosophical argumentation. One is as follows:

(1) Reason demands that we should perfect our humanity.

(2) The perfection of humanity consists in the unity of the form and sense drives.

(3) The unity of the form and sense drives is beauty.

Therefore [(4)], reason demands that we should create beauty. (p. 144)

A multitude of critical questions can be raised about the plausibility of the above conceptual definitions and logical entailments, not to mention the apparent oppressiveness of how reason "demands" (at what social cost?) that we should create beauty. The book succeeds nevertheless in establishing that Schiller's philosophizing typically has a prima facie coherent, logical rationale and is not fundamentally and obviously confused. The philosophical encapsulations offered may be brief in some instances, but they are benchmark starting-points and first approximations for anyone who wishes to explore Schiller's argumentation more deeply. As a rule, philosophical contents are sprinkled tastefully and noticeably into the main informational/historical/expository project, as sugar might be added to coffee.

The result is an excellent contribution to Schiller scholarship that historians of philosophy will enjoy and honor. Those who expect a crisp, detailed, and extended analysis of the philosophical issues that Schiller introduces, however, will sometimes only be tantalized. The book covers much ground, and it is essentially a meticulously-researched and historically informative apology for Schiller's philosophizing, just as the Letters themselves, according to Beiser, constitute Schiller's own apology for beauty.

We can now briefly consider Beiser's views on a couple of central interpretive issues. Most non-specialist readers of the book will be interested mainly in the chapter on the Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Man. Beiser claims that the Letters is not aestheticist (i.e., it is not escapist) and is instead politically and morally oriented towards actively improving social life. This is because aesthetic education -- one's self-conscious attention to, spiritual absorption of, and consequent behavioral instantiation of beauty -- aims to reinforce and cultivate people's moral awareness in a concrete, and not merely abstracted and contemplative sense. This is for the sake of creating good citizens. Ideally, aesthetic education will produce a set of people who will automatically act morally when they are given their freedom, as opposed to having violent and retributive inclinations, as happened horribly in France during Schiller's time. The 1793-95 Letters was written during and immediately after the French Revolution's bloody gravitation into the 1793-94 Reign of Terror, and Schiller had the chaotic French political situation troublingly in mind.

A prevailing view of Schiller's Letters (not to mention the bulk of his philosophical corpus) is that it is fundamentally conflicted: in some letters, beauty is described as a means to a moral end; in others it is described as an end in itself. It is, of course, not contradictory for something to be both a means to certain ends, while being simultaneously an end in itself. People are ends in themselves while they are also the means to achieve other purposes; virtues are also ends in themselves while they are also the means to other purposes such as happiness. There is no conflict in principle.

Beiser argues that when beauty is treated as a means in the Letters, aesthetic education is the main topic, and that when beauty is treated as an end in itself, the analysis or "analytic" of beauty is being highlighted. These are different and consistent aims. We accordingly read that "while the discussion of aesthetic education treats beauty as an instrument for moral and political ends, the theory of beauty regards it as an end in itself" (p. 123) and are led to infer that "the Ästhetische Briefe cannot be regarded, following its title, simply as a treatise on aesthetic education." The sections concerning beauty as an end in itself are consequently regarded as logically independent of, consistent with, and complementary to aesthetic education. Beiser integrates the two projects consistently by characterizing the Letters as an "apology for beauty," thus locating both aesthetic education and the theory of beauty under an amorphous umbrella-concept.

Schiller's two presentations of beauty are indeed consistent with each other and the Letters are not fundamentally confused. If, however, the Letters is not escapist, but is essentially empirically-focused, political and moral in its inspiration, then it is unsatisfying to characterize the more theoretical or transcendental analytic of beauty as a logically independent, yet thoroughly consistent pendant to the more empirical discussion of aesthetic education. One would aim for a logically tighter and determinate connection between the empirical theory of aesthetic education and the transcendental theory of beauty.

A more integrated rendition would regard aesthetic education as the single, essential, permeating, comprehensive and overriding theme of the Letters, for at least five reasons: (1) the manuscript was in fact entitled "aesthetic education," (2) Schiller was concerned with overcoming tyranny ever since he was a teenager, (3) Schiller was seriously alarmed about the Reign of Terror when he wrote the Letters, (4) "freedom is indeed the central theme behind all Schiller's writing" (p. 213), and with regard to the supposedly ill-fitting theory of beauty, (5) transcendental inquiries are prerequisite to empirical inquiries. Since the point of transcendental inquiries is to explain the very possibility of empirical payoffs such as scientific knowledge and moral behavior, the consequent purpose of Schiller's transcendental theory of beauty in the Letters can be seen as establishing the unconditional grounds for the possibility of aesthetic education.

The notion of aesthetic education contains the wherewithal to conceive of beauty consistently as a means and as an end in both empirical and transcendental terms. Schiller writes:

Through Beauty the sensuous person is led to form and to thought; through Beauty, the spiritual person is brought back to matter and restored to the sensory world. (Letter XVIII)

Durch die Schönheit wird der sinnliche Mensch zur Form und zum Denken geleitet; durch die Schönheit wird der geistige Mensch zur Materie zurückgeführt and der Sinnenwelt wiedergegeben.

For someone who is steeped in the sensory and selfish mode of being, beauty -- as defined by Schiller's transcendental and integrating "impulse theory" -- can serve to render the perception of the sensory world more disinterested, and can thereby allow such a person, via the disinterestedness involved, to ascend to a more purely conceptual awareness where inherent moral ideas can enter more impressively into awareness. Here, beauty serves as the means to ascend to moral ideas and constitutes the first half of the aesthetically educative process.

For political and social purposes, however, it is furthermore essential to concretize one's moral awareness for the sake of rendering it practically applicable. This, Schiller believes, can also be realized by beauty, and when this is in fact achieved, a person will become a beautiful soul, an end-in-itself. With the realization of this end, owing, one could say, to the moral "naturalness" implicit in such a beautifully-appearing-and-behaving being, social and political ends are simultaneously realized as well. In the ascent to moral awareness, beauty functions merely as a means, but in the concretization of morality and consequent rationalizing education of the natural inclinations, beauty serves as both a means and end in itself. This is all part of aesthetic education; the theory of beauty answers the Kantian question, "How is aesthetic education possible?"

The remaining "myths" cited at the outset concern Schiller's relationship with Kant, and Beiser convincingly dissolves some decades-long misconceptions of Schiller's moral theory. What emerges from the discussions, often repeated, is that Schiller, agreeing with Kant, maintained that morality has a purely rational foundation and that having inclinations towards doing one's duty (the "how" of moral activity) is consistent with being non-empirically and purely rationally motivated (the "why" of moral activity). This, Beiser observes, compares well with what neo-Kantian moral philosophers assert of Kant, although he adds that many of them fail to appreciate that Schiller held much the same views.

The standing differences between Kant and Schiller in this moral regard, we are told, concern their conflicting conception of the highest good. Kant's unconditional a priori moral foundation for the highest good (viz., as universal happiness conjoined with universal moral behavior) conflicts with Schiller's "anthropological" account, since the latter additionally advocates the development of individuality in conjunction with the development of the senses as ends in themselves. Kant would surely object to the development of the senses as ends in themselves, owing to their empirical and conditional nature.

In sum, the book's central thesis is that "in fundamental respects, Schiller's ethics and aesthetics are an improvement on Kant's" (p. 2). Schiller is not merely elevated to match Kant's status; he is rendered controversially into Kant's philosophical superior in terms of the quality of his insights. This reflects Beiser's initial statement that he "has come to praise rather than to bury Schiller" (p. viii). Amidst this celebration, the rhetorical tone appears to acknowledge Kant's ideas only out of necessity, for Kant is dutifully expounded, but rarely praised. This is somewhat unmindful of how Schiller obviously stands on Kant's shoulders at virtually every juncture. Perhaps the literary tone is justified by this impressive study's overriding aim to acknowledge Schiller's individuality as a philosopher, how he often departed from Kant, and how many other thinkers influenced him as well.