Scholastic Metaphysics: A Contemporary Introduction

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Edward Feser, Scholastic Metaphysics: A Contemporary Introduction, Editiones Scholasticae, 2014, 302pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 97838683854441.

Reviewed by Paul Symington, Franciscan University of Steubenville


Thomists look to the thought of Thomas Aquinas, his major interpreters, and Aristotle for guidance in addressing a full range of perennial problems that face philosophers. This is especially true regarding metaphysical (or metametaphysical) examinations. Although these authors are pre-scientific in the modern sense of the term, Thomists think that they get the principles right -- principles that are comprehensive and flexible and can contextualize, ground and enlighten subsequent discoveries gained by the progression of the empirical sciences. Whereas Thomists have also been actively engaged with the history of philosophy -- bringing Thomas's thought to bear on Heidegger, Kant, Hume, etc. -- a weakness is the dialectical distance between many Thomistic and analytic treatments. However, there are a growing number of so-called "analytic Thomists" who see great fruitfulness in an exchange of ideas between Thomism and the best that contemporary analytic philosophy has to offer. Yet, analytic Thomism is fraught with difficulties and can easily become misdirected. A successful translation and identification of battle lines in the debate are not easy to come by. Opposing but deeply seated presuppositions -- including logical, linguistic, intuitional and terminological! -- separate contemporary analytic philosophers and defenders of scholastic thought from the get-go. Edward Feser demonstrates a facility with both Scholastic and contemporary analytical concepts, and does much to span the divide between the two radical camps. His book continues to open up a space where real progress can be made not only in scholastic metaphysics, but metaphysics broadly envisioned.

Beyond identifying the scope and intentions that he has in mind, in the Prolegomenon Feser argues specifically for an approach inconsistent with naturalism and signals his intellectual sympathy with Scholastic, especially Thomistic, metaphysical modalities. In other words, Feser envisions the task of metaphysics not as articulating a metaphysical theory that trims its sails close as possible to the winds of science, nor merely engaging in conceptual analysis of folk notions that have no traction for conveying reality, but rather as engaged in an enterprise that is both prescriptive and prior in nature -- be it to the contributions of natural science or otherwise. For Feser, metaphysics is about nothing other than "the absolutely first principles of being" (pp. 6-7). Why take his particular tack? For one thing, what Feser takes as his primary competitor, scientism, is fundamentally flawed. He offers in quick succession three arguments against scientism: it is either self-defeating or uninteresting; it cannot provide a complete description of (even physical) reality; it cannot in principle offer a complete explanation of reality. Emboldened by recent work by Thomas Nagel and Michael Rea, among others, on the principled limitations of naturalism, and the direct way in which he targets weaknesses in that position, I thought that the arguments that Feser raises here are strong; and certainly strong enough to justify departing from contemporary naturalism, seeking greener pastures elsewhere where alternative beliefs are given the opportunity to stand on their own two legs.

Feser begins by scrutinizing Aristotelian actuality and potentiality. Signaling the importance of this chapter, Feser tells us that act and potency serves as "the organizing theme" insofar as what is said about other topics follows from it (p. 7). Not only is the act/potency relationship under-appreciated in contemporary scholarship on hylemorphic metaphysics (e.g., it is certainly not an organizing theme in Robert Pasnau's insightful recent Metaphysical Themes), but it provides the kind of conceptual framework that will help us best understand where hylemorphism is supposed to get us in understanding composite entities. As Thomas Aquinas mentions in De ente et essentia, considerations of a substance according to either formal or material considerations are distinct ways, based on really distinct principles, through which to correctly consider the substance as a whole: the material principle expresses potentiality in the whole whereas the form expresses what is actual in the same whole. Feser articulates this desideratum clearly.

In chapter one, Feser is largely concerned to show how a Thomistic account of act and potency, and the arguments supporting such a distinction, can be brought to bear on a contemporary metaphysics of causal powers, in hopes of overcoming contemporary limitations on the issue. He motivates the distinction by appeal to the reality of bone fide change and causal power. To account for one and the same thing changing -- a round ball becoming flattened -- one needs to recognize that when the ball actually has a round shape, that same ball has the potency to be flat. To deny this is to commit oneself to one of two absurd views: the static view where nothing changes or the view there is nothing permanent at all. Insofar as causal power (specifically at this point, efficient causal) should be understood as "that which brings something into being or changes it in some way" (p. 42), it should also be understood as the actualization of a potency. For example, to accurately describe a scenario where the sun is fading the color of a piece of fabric involves ascribing to the sun the causal power (active potency) to fade the color of fabric and ascribing to the fabric a potency to be faded by the sun. In fact, to deny that fabric has this (potential) feature in reality is to deny that it can be faded by the sun, and to deny such a real power to the sun is to deny that it can fade fabric!

By pointing to the interest of contemporary philosophy in the notion of powers (specifically in contexts of metaphysics and philosophy of science), Feser is saved from pleading for a relevancy for causal powers. However, Feser points out that contemporary metaphysicians are re-treading ground covered in a rather sophisticated way within scholastic thought; the latter transcends problems faced by contemporary thinkers due to the fact that they presume Humean views about the looseness and separateness between a cause and its effect when thinking through the issue. As a case in point, Feser looks to sustained criticisms of Lewis's counter-factual view of causation, which tries to analyze causation based solely on what happens (actualities) without appeal to powers. Likewise, in the philosophy of science, Feser sides with Nancy Cartwright, who argues that a powers ontology makes better sense of science, and Anjan Chakravartty, who maintains that a powers ontology saves scientific realism. Beyond a mere assent to causal powers, Feser thinks that causal powers are really distinct from the substances that have them (if they weren't, then change would be impossible) and that there are, fundamentally, categorical (expressing actuality) and dispositional properties (expressing potency); although the latter are mistakenly treated by philosophers today as actualities in their own right, thereby undercutting a correct view of reality that is expressed by a genuine real distinction among actuality and potentiality.

Although he looks at causal powers in the previous chapter, Feser defends some other principles involved in causation in chapter two. The principle of finality is that "every agent [i.e., efficient cause] acts for an end" (p. 92). It follows, then, that not only do organic entities act for an end (goal oriented behavior, say), but also inorganic things. To modern ears, such a principle is bizarre to say the least, but Feser softens the view by arguing that in order for there to be efficient causation (which there must be, as argued in the previous chapter), there must be final causation as a prior condition. As Feser puts it, "if A is by nature an efficient cause of B, then generating B must be the final cause of A" (p. 92). In order for A itself to bring about B, A must already intrinsically point toward the result B. One advantage of this perspective is that it provides a rationale for understanding the necessary connection between cause and effect -- A intrinsically points to result B -- while showing how certain effects can in principle be frustrated -- A fails to bring about B in actuality given some mitigating conditions.

The principle of causation (PC), which applies to both active and passive potencies, is given as "nothing can be reduced from potentiality to actuality, except by something in a state of actuality" (p. 105). Feser criticizes arguments drawn from Hume, Russell, and classical and quantum physics that deny the principle. Inductive support for the principle may be drawn from experiences both of the external world and from observation of our own actions. The conclusion that causation is not observable flows from Hume's false analysis of cause and effect as non-simultaneous. But there are strong counter-examples to this (e.g., a magnet stuck to an iron bar), including intuitive internal experiences of our actions on the world as simultaneous with the effects that we bring about (Feser thinks that not all causal relations are simultaneous, but that all essentially ordered causal relations are).

In addition, Feser supports the full force of the PC by way of the principle of sufficient reason, which purports that there is an "adequate necessary objective explanation for the being of whatever is and for all attributes of any being" (pp. 137-38). Since a given thing has a range of potential effects it may be subjected to, if PC were false and some effect were actualized within the thing without something actual bringing it about, the effect would lack intelligibility insofar as there would be no reason why this potency was actualized and not some other. Of course, in order to make this argument, Feser defends the PSR as well.

From PSR and PC comes the principle of proportionate causality, which is given as "whatever perfection exists in an effect must be found in the effective cause" -- nemo dat quod non habet (pp. 154-55). This principle is clearly false if one doesn't interpret the notion of a perfection being found in the cause in a very broad sense of 'eminently or virtually contained in the cause'. Yet, it follows from PSR and PC insofar as if the perfection in the effect is not found wholly in its cause, there would be residual potency in the effect that would be actualized without explanation.

Chapter three discusses substance. Feser favors a view of substance that is analyzed into two distinct principles of form and matter, which are themselves understood in a relation of act and potency to each other. Form "is that intrinsic principle by which a thing exhibits whatever permanence, perfection, and identity that it does" whereas matter "is that intrinsic principle by which a thing exhibits the changeability, imperfection, and diversity that it does" (p. 162). On one hand, forms are divided into substantial and accidental. A substantial form is that principle of a thing by which it has an intrinsic directedness toward certain ends, whereas accidental forms merely modify already existing substances and are not associated with any intrinsic directedness to an end (p. 170). On the other hand, matter should be understood as either secondary or primary. What grounds this distinction is the relation that matter has to substantial form. Secondary matter is a consideration of matter as it has been actually informed by a substantial form, whereas secondary matter is a consideration of matter without it having any given substantial form actualized within it, but only remaining in potency to some substantial form.

Feser examines an alternative metaphysical view of atomism, which asserts that all change and the nature of objects are fully explained only by appeal to the arrangement of particles. In the wake of a modern adaptation of atomism comes either reductive materialism (the object composed of particles exists in some sense but is at least causally reduced to its material parts) or eliminativism (the so-called object composed of particles does not exist). Feser argues that it is a mistake to infer material reductionism or eliminativism from the fact that a thing has compositional elements. A way of blocking that move is to claim that the elements (atomic parts) exist not actually in the composed object but virtually only. If elements are virtual, then it makes no sense that the composite substance can be reduced to them, so it is the composite substance that retains the status of being what is actual. To support the conclusion that such things exist only virtually, Feser cites an argument by David Oderberg in Real Essentialism to the effect that a composite object cannot be reduced or eliminated in favor of its material parts because the former exhibits contrary properties to the properties of its parts. For example, whereas hydrogen is flammable, water, which has hydrogen as some of its parts, extinguishes flames. Thus, since some of these properties are absent in the composite, there is an absence of the essences from which they necessarily flow, and so they don't exist actually in the composite. They exist virtually insofar as they retain in the composite some of the powers of the elements in themselves.

Even if someone were to accept the principles set forth by Feser in his book so far, short of accepting the doctrine of virtually existing elements, I wonder if one couldn't still get away with a reductionism or eliminativism (R/E). Say someone accepted that basic material particles each in themselves have an intrinsic directedness to realize a certain range of ends -- like the attraction between an electron and a proton -- even if a given end is not actually being realized. Then, it would be these particles that would be substances in Feser's understanding of the term and would be actual and not virtual. I don't see why someone couldn't merely hold that there is no existing composite entity, only individual elemental particles that are complexes of actualized and unactualized potencies in themselves. That is, there are no unique actualities and potencies (causally or otherwise) that the composed entities have over and above the actualities and potencies of its parts. That water can extinguish a flame instead of combusting will not have to do with properties that the water has, but rather on the actualities and potentialities that the elements of the water each themselves have instead. To put it another way, instead of claiming that the unified subject of actualities and potentialities are the composite entities, it is the elements that are said to be the unified subjects of actualities and potentialities. Of course, these R/E views face further problems when it comes to conscious and rational beings, which Feser points out, but as it stands one might be able to get away with biological R/E here.

But there is the question about why one would want to be an R/E when there are good reasons not to be (as provided by Feser). A way at justifying the kind of naturalism that I described above can be had by looking at an argument Feser employs in various places. Feser gives the following formulation of an argument for scientism:

(1) The predictive power and technological applications of science are unparalleled by those of any other purported source of knowledge.

(2) Therefore what science reveals to us is probably all that is real.

Feser says that the above argument is as bad as this one:

(3) Metal detectors have had far greater success in finding coins and other metallic objects in more places than any other method has.

(4) Therefore, what metal detectors reveal to us (coins and other metallic objects) is probably all that is real (p. 22).

He is right that the arguments parallel each other and both of them are bad, but I'm not sure that the formulation of the original argument is as strong as it could be. First, one might infer from (1) that (1.1) science is a reliable source of knowledge. Building on that, one might point out that (1.2) there are things that we learn from science that undercuts the truth of beliefs that we obtain from other sources (such as mere common sense judgments). For example, although common sense tells us that a biological organism acts in an autonomous way and is not reducible to its parts, the law of conservation of energy via science suggests that the exchange and direction of energy is fully accounted for at the basic level of material elements. In other words, what determines how the energy is exchanged is determined ultimately at the elemental level. There are other beliefs that we hold that also seem undermined by the claims of science, such as the dissonance between what we think is motivating us to do x and the "true" motivations for action x obtained from psychological, evolutionary or economic analyses. Finally, it also seems true that (1.3) science has a vast range of subjects that it investigates. From (1.2) we can get something like (1.4) non-scientifically based beliefs are not reliable, which, with (1.1) and (1.3), gets us closer to conclusion (2).

The final chapter has essence -- that whereby a thing is what it is -- and existence -- that which is the actuality of an essence -- as its focus. This chapter is particularly a nice example of the service that Feser renders to the task of enhancing points of commonality between scholastic and analytic thinkers. In this chapter, Feser defends a realist form of essentialism as well as argues for a real distinction between essence and existence. As is characteristic of the book as a whole, Feser brings in contemporary views in way that makes good use of, and is charitable to, contemporary developments in metaphysics. For example, although he clearly lays out anti-essentialist arguments from Quine, Popper and Wittgenstein, he specifically address them in the context of moderate realism, a Thomistic solution to the problem of universals that stands between naïve realism and nominalism. Similarly, on the other side of the aisle -- essentialism -- he ably points out discrepancies between the essentialism of Kripke, and that of Thomists. As a final example, Feser mounts a strong case that the Fregean notion of existence is simply not the last word on the debate over whether existence can be treated as a predicate of a thing.

In all, Feser's new book is a welcome addition for those interested in bringing the concepts, terminology and presuppositions between scholastic and contemporary analytic philosophers to commensuration. In fact, I would contend that Feser's book will constitute an important piece in its own right for guiding the research program for contemporary Thomistic metaphysicians into the future.