Schopenhauer: A Biography

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David E. Cartwright, Schopenhauer: A Biography, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 575pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521825986.

Reviewed by Günter Zöller, University of Munich


In recent years academic presses have inundated the English-language book market with expository and explanatory publications on individual philosophers or an individual work by a philosopher, typically authored by a select team of international specialists. These companions and cooperative commentaries are designed both as introductions and orientations for the student reader and as surveys of the current state of research for the advanced reader or scholar. The auxiliary corps of such handbooks has established itself as a third force in addition to the single-author monograph and the topical multiple-author essay collection in the arsenal of academic publishing. The major publishers effectively have turned away from making available the revised proceedings of academic conferences on specialized topics, turning instead to more generally-oriented work that is commissioned by the presses and their academic series editors with a close regard to supply and demand in the academic publication market.

The didactic turn in academic philosophical publishing also has generated a good number of book-length biographies of major philosophers that integrate the presentation of a philosopher's work into an account of his personal and professional life. Given the scarcity of biographical material on ancient and medieval philosophers, the biographies mostly are devoted to philosophers of the modern era, from Spinoza (Steven Nadler, 2001) through Kant (Manfred Kuehn, 2002) and Hegel (Terry Pinkard, 2000) to Nietzsche (Julian Young, 2010). A further installment in preparation is a biography of Fichte written by Manfred Kuehn. The biographies of modern philosophers are all fairly extensive, providing detailed information about the circumstances of their "hero's" life in the context of his times and interwoven with an account of the development, the outlines and the results of his philosophical work.

As a fairly recent genre in academic publishing, the philosophers' biographies have replaced earlier ways of devoting an entire book to a single philosopher in which the biographical information was incidental or set off from the presentation of the philosopher's work, as indicated in the standard formula or subtitle "life and work" (French L'homme et l'œuvre, German Leben und Werk), itself a late descendant of the pairing of biography and doxography in the classical compilation by Diogenes Laertius (The Lives and Opinions of Eminent Philosophers). Chief examples of the earlier style of biography are Ernst Cassirer's Kant's Life and Thought (German original 1916; English translation 1983) and the monumental history of modern philosophy undertaken by Kuno Fischer in a series of single-philosopher volumes in the late nineteenth century, including treatments of Spinoza, Leibniz, Kant, Fichte, Schelling and Hegel (10 in 11 volumes 1897-1902). In contrast to their late nineteenth- and early twentieth-century predecessors, the current wave of philosophical biographies is less scholarly in design and presentation and more oriented toward instructional delight or delightful instruction. The new biographical genre in philosophy is that of a Sachbuch rather than a Fachbuch, to employ a fine-grained terminology used in German bibliographical science.

Viewed in a larger perspective, the biographical craze in philosophy is part of a general readers' interest in narrative accounts of the lives of historical and contemporary figures in entertainment, politics and the arts. In bookstores, typically an entire section is devoted to this genre that mixes fact and fiction and that seems able to satisfy, however vicariously, a contemporary craving for meaning and message in people's lives. A further factor in the general biobibliomania is the biographies' reach into the mind -- and the heart -- of their protagonists, making the contemporary biographies and autobiographies a late descendant of the modern novel and its cognitive claim to psychological and sociological insights.

The specific revelatory role of biography in philosophy can be dated back to Nietzsche's typological characteristic of past philosophers, begun in his early unpublished account of the pre-Socratics -- the "pre-Platonic philosophers," as he calls them for a reason -- in Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks (1873) and culminating in his enthusiastic endorsement of Lou von Salomé's project of tracing the philosophical systems to the personnel files of their originators (letter, presumably, from 16 September 1882). In the recent biographies, Nietzschean pathology has been turned into Balzacian breadth and Victorian circumstance. Once larger than life, the great philosophers are made to appear human, interesting and intelligent but not unlike their readers with or without a Ph.D. What tends to get lost in this perspective from below is the challenge posed by any philosopher worth this title -- an intellectual challenge to struggle with problems and solutions that stress our abilities to the breaking point and an existential challenge to examine life, one's own life but also the lives of others, in effect all our lives, in the light of views so extreme and exhaustive that things may never seem the same again.

The most recent entry on the philosophical biography list is David Cartwright's tome on Arthur Schopenhauer. In addition to having published numerous articles on the philosophy of Schopenhauer, especially on his ethics, and having served as president of the North American Division of the Schopenhauer Society, Cartwright is the author of the Historical Dictionary of Schopenhauer's Philosophy (2004), which already exhibits a biographical approach to Schopenhauer's thought. Now Schopenhauer's life is the stuff of biography. Unlike his philosophical contemporaries and predecessors, he did not spend an entire life devoted to academic teaching and career building. He came to advanced schooling, university studies and academic philosophy somewhat late, after a detour through an apprenticeship as a merchant. But he also had the advantage of social privilege and financial independence over his colleagues and competitors, who often were not able to travel much and did not have Schopenhauer's first-hand experience of the larger world outside of libraries and lecture halls.

To be sure, the narrative potential of his life has not escaped earlier writers on Schopenhauer. In fact, there are several fairly recent and quite successful biographies or biographical accounts of Schopenhauer available, some of them even written in English or published in English translation. To begin with, there is Arthur Hübscher's extensive biographical sketch of Schopenhauer's life (Arthur Schopenhauer. Ein Lebendsbild) that opens the first volume of the critical edition of Schopenhauer's works edited by Hübscher (first edition 1937). More recently, the German philosopher-turned-philosophical-biographer, Rüdiger Safranski, issued a very well-received, almost novelistic rendition of Schopenhauer's life (Schopenhauer and the Wild Years of Philosophy; German edition 1987, English translation 1991). Moreover, Bryan Magee's volume, The Philosophy of Schopenhauer, which contains a close account of Schopenhauer's philosophical thought and its influence, opens with a succinct chapter on "Schopenhauer's Life as Background to his Work" (1983, revised edition 1997).

What Cartwright's biography adds to the existing body of biographical work on Schopenhauer is breadth and detail. Cartwright narrates Schopenhauer's life without haste or abridgment. He is particularly informative on the early Schopenhauer, from his family background through his upper-class upbringing to his early travels and stays abroad. A further focal point is the role of the early death of Schopenhauer's father (probably from suicide) for the philosophical turn in young Schopenhauer's life. Another welcome feature is the extensive discussion of Schopenhauer's university studies in several fields and at two quite different universities, British-influenced Göttingen and early Continental Berlin. Next there is the panorama painted by Cartwright of Schopenhauer's years in Weimar, where his mother -- an increasingly fashionable writer of novels and other prose works -- had relocated after the death of her husband and where Schopenhauer came into closer contact with Goethe. Cartwright traces with great care the complex personal relations between Schopenhauer and his mother and the short-lived collaboration between Schopenhauer and Goethe in experimentation with light and colors.

Cartwright already has reached the halfway point in his biography when he turns to the emergence and early development of Schopenhauer's system as contained in his main work, The World as Will and Representation (first published in 1818, bearing the year 1819 on the title page). After outlining the further development of Schopenhauer's thinking in subsequent publications Cartwright focuses on the original, one-volume version of the main work, which later was to be more than doubled in size by the addition of a second volume. He gives a succinct presentation of each of the original work's four books, ranging from the epistemology of Book One through the metaphysics of nature of Book Two and the metaphysics of art of Book Three to the metaphysics of morals of Book Four, not omitting Schopenhauer's prefatory reading instructions, viz., to read the work twice, to study his doctoral dissertation On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (1813) as an introduction into the main work, and to become acquainted with the principal works of Kant, on which Schopenhauer's main work builds. In addressing the unity of Schopenhauer's magnum opus, Cartwright follows earlier interpreters, notably Rudolf Malter and John Atwell, who have taken seriously Schopenhauer's self-description of his entire philosophy as summarized by a "single thought" (der Eine Gedanke), viz., that the world is the self-knowledge of the will.

Rather than dwelling on the details or fine points of Schopenhauer's system, Cartwright's biographical account moves on to Schopenhauer's failed attempts at a university career in Berlin and his eventual retreat from academia, his extensive travels and sojourns throughout Europe and his finally settling in Frankfurt, where he was to spend the remaining decades of his life, continuing to add to and edit his works in a daily routine not unlike the one under which his philosophical idol, Immanuel Kant, had maintained productivity and creativity into old age, albeit with less physical vigor than Schopenhauer, who was fond of taking regular baths in the river Main all year long.

Of particular interest to today's readers might be Cartwright's brief account of Schopenhauer's reactionary response to the revolutionary events in the German lands in 1848/49, in particular in his adopted hometown, Frankfurt, where the first German parliamentary assembly gathered during those years, only to meet with complete failure when attempting to achieve German unification under a constitutional monarchy. Also noteworthy is Cartwright's short report on Schopenhauer's response to the work of Richard Wagner, who sent him the libretto of the Ring cycle he was yet to compose. The copy is preserved in Harvard's Houghton Library and includes Schopenhauer's handwritten remarks documenting his moral outrage at the incestuous love affair between Siegmund and Sieglinde. Cartwright ends his biography with Schopenhauer's death and funeral, foregoing detailing his far-reaching and long-lasting effect and influence on Western literature, the visual arts, music -- and philosophy, which he had mentioned briefly in the preface.

Cartwright's biography of Schopenhauer is a long read but full of fascinating material. It manages to conjure up the image of a human being not to be emulated but admired for his aggressive self-reliance, his vigorous independence, his intellectual honesty and his provocative contribution to modern thought.