Schopenhauer and the Aesthetic Standpoint: Philosophy as a Practice of the Sublime

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Sophia Vasalou, Schopenhauer and the Aesthetic Standpoint: Philosophy as a Practice of the Sublime, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 237pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107024403.

Reviewed by Mary Troxell, Boston College


While Schopenhauer's pessimism stands as the ultimate truth of his philosophy,[1] his aesthetics more often has been the source of inspiration and admiration among his readers. Sophia Vasalou provides a new approach to reading Schopenhauer's philosophy that allows his aesthetics to take center stage. In the first half of the book, she reconstructs some of the central arguments in Schopenhauer's metaphysical system in order to demonstrate that Schopenhauer conceives of his philosophical project in aesthetic terms, and that his account of the sublime provides the key to understanding what the experience of achieving philosophical insight involves. In the second half, which is more speculative in nature, Vasalou explores how Schopenhauer's philosophy can be constructively engaged so that it can speak to contemporary concerns.

Vasalou begins with an overview of Schopenhauer's philosophical system in order to identify his methodology. She notes that in demonstrating his central metaphysical claim that the world is will, Schopenhauer regards philosophical insight as the result of an ascent from perception to abstract expression. Vasalou reviews the steps that Schopenhauer takes in drawing out the aesthetic and ethical consequences of his metaphysics of will, and she finds the same pattern of perception and ascent. More specifically, Vasalou identifies two distinct movements that lead to philosophical insight: the movement inward, which gives awareness of the thing-in-itself as will and which serves to ground Schopenhauer's pessimism, and the move outward to the realm of Ideas, which reveals the world's nature beyond the distorting lens of one's own subjectivity.

Much of Vasalou's analysis consists of outlining these two movements in Schopenhauer's thought, an exercise that bears much fruit for understanding Schopenhauer's project. By distinguishing these two movements, she can defend Schopenhauer against charges of incoherence, in part by bringing out the central role that perception plays in his methodology. Moreover, by underscoring the role of the outward, transcendent direction in Schopenhauer's philosophy, an approach that heretofore has been inadequately recognized as central to Schopenhauer's philosophical method, Vasalou can provide a reading of Schopenhauer that is both more compelling and more relevant to modern readers. She spells out the consequences of this reading in the later portions of the book.

Vasalou turns her focus to the tensions in Schopenhauer's accounts of aesthetic contemplation and of human mortality, tensions that have led many scholars to charge his philosophy with incoherence, and she reveals how these tensions can be the source of insight into Schopenhauer's method. The upshot of her analysis is that these tensions can be properly understood in the context of Schopenhauer's account of the sublime. Moreover, the pattern that characterizes the sublime, a movement inward and upward that involves a dialectic of mastery and vulnerability, constitutes Schopenhauer's philosophical method throughout his works.

By situating Schopenhauer's philosophical project in the experience of sublimity, Vasalou sheds light on the much criticized discrepancy between the exuberant tone of Schopenhauer's writing and his dour pessimistic conclusions. If philosophy's starting point is aesthetic perception, then Schopenhauer's strikingly visual and metaphorical language is not anterior to Schopenhauer's position but rather is employed to foster the kind of perception that philosophical insight requires. In addition, and here Vasalou does some of her finest work in unpacking Schopenhauer's writings to defend this claim, those who dismiss Schopenhauer's system because of the inadequacy of his arguments fail to recognize the strictures Schopenhauer himself places on the efficacy of reason as an instrument for achieving philosophical insight.

I found Vasalou's account of the aesthetic nature of Schopenhauer's project to be immensely fruitful. Schopenhauer himself repeatedly characterized philosophy as an aesthetic undertaking, and Schopenhauer scholars have conceded this point as well. What makes her book an important addition to Schopenhauer scholarship is her careful investigation of how this claim bears on the way he constructs his philosophical system.

While in the first half of the book Vasalou provides a careful reconstruction of key aspects of Schopenhauer's thought, in the second half she turns her attention to considering how Schopenhauer's philosophy can be most constructively engaged. In this latter portion, her approach to Schopenhauer's thought is more creative, and she draws on a wide range of philosophical writings outside of the German tradition in her analysis.

An endorsement of Schopenhauer's works, according to Vasalou, requires responding to both those who dismiss his philosophy as incoherent and those who reject it as irrelevant.Vasalou addresses both issues through demonstrating that Schopenhauer's philosophy is best understood as a form of expression, and she cleverly draws on the writings of some of Schopenhauer's most distinguished readers, Georg Simmel and Friedrich Nietzsche among them, to defend her claim. Such an account can preserve the value of his thought, even while conceding its moments of incoherence, and at the same time demonstrate its relevance insofar as it is a response to conditions similar to our own.

Vasalou's more "expressive" reading begins with an examination of Schopenhauer's account of pessimism, and she suggests that this doctrine is best understood as an expression of both his character and his context. She finds Schopenhauer's argument for pessimism wanting, primarily because of the impoverished understanding of happiness and pleasure that undergirds his argument. However, rather than regarding the inadequacy of Schopenhauer's demonstration of pessimism as reason to dismiss his thought, Vasalou invites us to consider his pessimistic outlook as the source of his relevance. Schopenhauer's pessimistic view of desire is rooted in an awareness of homelessness or unmooring, of a world denuded of meaning and purpose, and this standpoint characterizes our own age as well. Therefore, investigating his pessimism can reveal the significance of his thought to the present age.

Once Schopenhauer's pessimism is understood in this way, an alternative response to his pessimism within the framework of his philosophical system also becomes possible. With this in mind, Vasalou offers a reading of his thought that can preserve the philosophical insights located in his aesthetics while leaving his pessimism behind. Employing his account of sublimity as a starting point, she provides an approach to his philosophical system that would allow what she calls a "leap to the ethical," a leap that would be impossible in the context of his pessimism.

The most speculative portion of her book is her working through this alternative and explaining what such a leap might involve. Vasalou begins with an analysis of Schopenhauer's later essay "Aphorisms on the Wisdom of Life," in which he seems to provide the kind of pragmatic advice he disparaged and deemed useless in his more serious philosophical works. Vasalou rejects the possibility of reading these later musings back into his system as a way of providing normative content to Schopenhauer's philosophy. However, she does find these passages helpful in bringing out a salient feature of his character, one that finds affinity with the Stoics: Schopenhauer responds to the vulnerability that characterizes the human condition by withdrawing from the world.

Vasalou returns to Schopenhauer's account of the sublime for a more promising alternative to this response of withdrawal. She begins the reconstruction by connecting his description of the sublime with the notion of contemplation in the writings of Plato and the Stoics. Vasalou next links Schopenhauer's philosophical approach, characterized by the sublime, to the virtue of magnanimity (megalopsychia) in Aristotle, and in particular the tension between a withdrawal from the world and an engagement with the world that characterizes this virtue. Once she links the notion of self-conquest in megalopsychia with an evaluation of character, she can argue that the movement toward transcendence in the sublime has ethical ramifications. Because this movement has ethical significance, the possibility of failure exists as well, and Vasalou locates this failure in the response to this transcendent viewpoint.

Taking her cues from Martha Nussbaum's analysis of youth and old age in Aristotle's Rhetoric, Vasalou offers a distinction between ethically positive and negative responses to the standpoint of transcendence. Whereas the standpoint of the young, which Aristotle labels as magnanimous, involves engagement in the world, the point of view of the old involves a recoiling from the world in the face of their own vulnerability. she only has to connect Aristotle's account of the suspicious recoiling of the elderly with Schopenhauer's advice to his readers in his "Aphorisms on the Wisdom of Life" to argue that Schopenhauer's pessimism may not be the only possible response to philosophical enlightenment. Rather, Schopenhauer's pessimistic vision points to a failure of megalopsychia. A more positive response to the human condition is possible, even in the context of a disenchanted universe.

Vasalou ends by exploring what a more positive response to this "view from nowhere" that characterizes the sublime would look like, one that the achievement of megalopsychia would make possible in the context of our secular age. She finds her answer, which she calls an "ethics of redescent," in the possibilities that Alasdair McIntyre lays out in his iconic work, After Virtue. McIntyre defends traditional Greek virtues and argues that such a redescent is possible, even in the face of the evaluative breakdown that marks the modern age. Vasalou concludes by employing MacIntyre's vision, a vision marked by hope instead of despair and resignation, to describe what a redescent might look like in the context of Schopenhauer's philosophy.

I found Vasalou's "ethics of redescent" the least satisfying portion of her book, and in particular her connecting Schopenhauer's account of aesthetic contemplation with the Greek notion of philosophical contemplation. Schopenhauer's genius may have an intellect capable of contemplating the Ideas in nature, but this is because his intellect is a "monstrosity"[2] that can temporarily break free from its own willing. This contemplation cannot be sustained, and the objects of contemplation represent only a middle ground between how the world appears to us and what the world in truth is. And while the Ideas may be beautiful, Schopenhauer also points out that the truth revealed in contemplation is the ruthless nature of the will.[3] The essence of all existence, including that of the genius, is blind aimless willing, which the intellect unwittingly and continuously serves. Contemplation can only provide temporary relief from this fact. For these reasons, contemplative activity in Schopenhauer does not have the vaunted status it has for the Greeks, and I would argue that it cannot play the role that Vasalou assigns for it as a starting point for an ethics of hope. While she is aware of these points, for she is a very careful reader of Schopenhauer, she finds the commonalities between the Greeks and Schopenhauer more relevant than the differences, and she can do so because she decouples Schopenhauer's account of the sublime from his metaphysics and his pessimism. However, one may be left wondering whether the revisions Vasalou introduces in order to save Schopenhauer's thought from irrelevance leave enough of the original thinker intact.

Vasalou does offer a compelling defense for her more creatively engaged way of reading Schopenhauer's work, however, and the philosophical fruitfulness of her interpretation makes it well worth reading. Her arguments are original and philosophically rich, and her mastery of Schopenhauer scholarship written in English is comprehensive. Her ability to bring Schopenhauer's thought into conversation with a wide range of thinkers speaks to her intellectual breadth, and the elegance and evocativeness of her prose befits a specialist of one of the greatest stylists in philosophy. For all of these reasons, I enjoyed Vasalou's book immensely and would recommend it to any serious reader of Schopenhauer.

[1] “Nothing else can be stated as the aim of our existence except the knowledge that it would be better for us not to exist. This is the most important of all truths.” Arthur Schopenhauer, The World as Will and Representation, vols. 1 and 2, trans. E. F. J. Payne (New York, Dover Press), 1966, WWR2, 605. These will be referred to, hereafter, as WWR1 and WWR2, respectively.

[2] "physiology could class such a surplus of brain activity [that characterizes the genius], and with it the brain itself, with the monstra per defectum.” WWR2, 377.

[3] WWR1267.  Non-geniuses can experience aesthetic contemplation when beholding works of art, but the contemplation of the genius is paradigmatic of the activity.