Schopenhauer's The World as Will and Representation: A Reader's Guide

Placeholder book cover

Robert L. Wicks, Schopenhauer's The World as Will and Representation: A Reader's Guide, Continuum, 2011, 184pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441104342.

Reviewed by Alistair Welchman, University of Texas at San Antonio


Robert Wicks's short book stands at the intersection of two tendencies: the renaissance in interest in Schopenhauer over the past decade or so and the increasing prevalence of introductory guides on the academic book market. Wicks's achievement is, I think, to be measured by the extent to which he manages to work within a highly constrained medium and yet introduce students to Schopenhauer as a thinker with whom they may want to go beyond mere introduction and towards establishing an actual acquaintance with Schopenhauer's work and thought. This achievement is considerable, and, at least for the most, where Wicks does not succeed, it seems to me that it is the medium itself that is at fault.

There are already a number of books that offer introductions to Schopenhauer, including the Very Short Introduction (Oxford 2002) by renowned Schopenhauer scholar Chris Janaway. But the Continuum Reader's Guide distinguishes itself in two ways: first, by being explicitly directed at early undergraduate students with little or no prior exposure to philosophy; and second, by taking the form of what used to be known as a commentary.

Continuum imposes a uniform basic structure on their guides: they all consist of four chapters and some "notes for further reading". Chapter 1 is entitled "Context." Chapter 2 is an "Overview of Themes." Chapter 3 ("Reading the Text") comprises the bulk of the book (about two-thirds) and takes the form of a section-by-section commentary on The World as Will and Representation. Chapter 4 is on Schopenhauer's "Reception and Influence", and in this case the 'notes for further reading' is just a bibliography organized by topic.

Wicks's characterization of the basic novelty of Schopenhauer's philosophical position, that the in-itself of the world should be identified with will, is vivid and compelling. He writes that for Schopenhauer the will is a "blind, timeless, pointless urge" (1), that it "is unconscious, uncaring, unknowing, amoral, and fundamentally goalless" (2). And his account of Schopenhauer's argument for his signature claim that the in-itself of everything is will is both clear, appropriately hedged, intellectually sophisticated, and responds intelligently to the secondary literature. Wicks gives a neat presentation of Schopenhauer's phenomenological argument that, although my body is also an external representation among other representations, I have an additional sui generis awareness of it from the inside as will. But the conclusion Schopenhauer wants to reach is that this will is the inner aspect of everything. In The World as Will and Representation, Schopenhauer says that we judge other external objects on an "analogy with our body" (§19, Sämtliche Werke, ed. Hübscher, Vol. 2, p. 125), and the simplest interpretation of the argument would be that he is relying on an extended version of the commonplace argument from analogy in the philosophy of mind.

The argument raises several problems however. One obvious Kantian criticism asks how it is possible for whatever awareness I have of my body as will to constitute any kind of metaphysical cognition. Even on Schopenhauer's simplification of Kant's system, cognition involves explanation along the lines of one of the forms of the principle of sufficient reason. But whatever the in-itself is, it cannot be subordinated to the principle of sufficient reason. And it seems to follow that we cannot have any cognition of it. Another issue is that the argument from analogy seems particularly weak in this case. It is one thing to argue from my dual awareness of my body as both external object and locus of my own internality to the probable existence of other such loci of inwardness correlated with my merely external experience of the bodies of other people. It is quite another to, as Schopenhauer wants, infer that every external object has such inwardness.

Wicks gives a generous and subtle account of these issues, and does so with exemplary clarity. He argues first that "comprising representational cognition" might be a matter of degree rather than all or nothing. Thus because the experience of willing is only temporal and neither spatial nor causal it is, as it were, less representational that regular outer experience (60). Then he suggests an alternative: that it is because time is, as Kant would have it, the form of inner sense that its cognitive structure is precisely that of inwardness. In this case it is not the absence of other cognitive determinations that makes knowledge of the will metaphysical, but rather the positive contribution of merely temporal experience as the structure of the experience of inwardness (61). This is already a sophisticated account. But Wicks goes further still, elaborating another response involving Schopenhauer's account of the nunc stans or eternal present of the scholastics. Although Schopenhauer mentions this explicitly only in his aesthetics in Book III, Wicks usefully recalls it here to suggest a way in which the temporal cognitive structure of the inner experience of will can approach the putative atemporality of the in-itself (61). I am not completely convinced that this is true: atemporality looks qualitatively distinct from omnitemporality, i.e., existence at all times (of which the eternal now would be a version), and hence does not appear to be approachable in this way.

Then Wicks takes on the argument from analogy and tries to show that the apparent weakness of the argument should be understood as evidence that Schopenhauer in fact was advancing a different argument (63). This is a common tactic in the secondary literature, and Wicks is in silent but effective dialogue with both Dale Jacquette and Julian Young here. He argues that there are two grounds for Schopenhauer's claim. First, that it is more 'philosophically coherent' (64) to attribute the same in-itself to other things as to my own body. And second, that the conditions for individuation are identical to the conditions for external representation as an object. It follows from this second condition that everything must have in some sense the 'same' (or better: a non-different) in-itself. Thus if I can identify it in my case, I have identified it in all cases. Again, these conclusions are not beyond reproach. The first argument is a type of best explanation argument. But explanations are the provision of grounds or reasons. And the principle of sufficient reason is supposed precisely not to obtain between the in-itself and representation. But these sections are masterful in their ability to bring out the interpretive complexity of Schopenhauer's position with such a light stylistic touch that one is almost unaware of the intricacy of their -- and Schopenhauer's -- argumentation.

There is only one moment of awkwardness here, when Wicks's usually deft hand at finding vivid imagery from Schopenhauer (or inventing his own) fails him. He describes the inwardness of our own relation to our body in contrast to the externality of all other objects like this: "We pick up a cup of coffee to drink, and feel the inside of our hand, but do not feel the inside of the cup" (58). But of course we can feel the inside of the cup! Of course we feel only its topological 'inside', not its, as it were, phenomenological inside. A moment's reflection reveals what Wicks means, but this is a moment of unnecessary confusion for the reader. This is really a quibble though, one that indeed stands out in contrast to the strength of all the other images he uses. One of these images in particular is forceful enough to have serious philosophical import, although Wicks does not pursue it here. It concerns Schopenhauer's paradoxical claim that that on the one hand the world as representation is a function of human organs of perception; but on the other those very organs of perception possess a physical etiology with the world of representations; or, as Wicks puts it: "My mind is in my head, which is part of the world as representation, and my head is in my mind. The subject is in the object and the object is in the subject" (78). Wicks compares this to the 'strange loops' mentioned by Douglas Hofstadter and to the other examples Hofstadter mentions of similarly paradoxically mutually self-constituting phenomena like Escher's famous portrait Drawing Hands. This is a potent image for one of the central difficulties of Schopenhauer's thought.

These are probably the most central arguments of Schopenhauer's philosophy, and they merit the care Wicks gives them, both in the account of §§17-19 of Book II (54ff) and earlier in §§1-2 of Book I (13-14, 35). But this level of engagement is repeated for a number of other topics where Wicks provides substantial critical engagement and originality. For instance, Wicks makes good running use of Schopenhauer's argument that Kant inconsistently applies the category of cause and the form of an object to the thing-in-itself, which is supposed to be refractory to experience. Schopenhauer solves this dilemma, according to the reading Wicks emphasizes, by substituting an expressive (rather than a causal) relation between in-itself and representation. I also think the comparison between Schopenhauer's account of concepts and Plato's account of art in Book X of The Republic (104) is both original and pedagogically helpful. And I admire the forthrightness with which he declares that Schopenhauer's so-called aesthetics in Book III do not really have much to do with art at all (92-3).

Similarly, in the last book, Wicks promotes his own signature claim that Schopenhauer's ultimate recommendation is not escape from a repugnant world of suffering, but rather a disengagement from one's desires that remains fully compatible with a compassion that is the practical realization of the cognitive insight into one's metaphysical identity with everything. Again, I am not sure I would want to defend this view, but it is a nice strong reading that gives students something to bite into conceptually. In particular, it culminates in Wicks's controversial claim that the freedom of the will, which Schopenhauer systematically distinguishes from personal freedom by describing it as the freedom of the will from the principle of sufficient reason, can in fact be identified with a kind of personal freedom -- at the point where the enlightened individual identifies with the will as such and frees the self from desire by virtue of manifesting the freedom of the will from determination by grounds.

Nevertheless, the format of the book imposed by the publisher requires Wicks to devote at least some time to each and every section of what is a long and itself somewhat uneven text. Even with some tactical telescoping of the less rich sections, this leaves more time than one would want during which Wicks is essentially just going along with what Schopenhauer says rather than engaging actively with it. A more flexible structure might have allowed Wicks to thematize central concerns more clearly.

I did not find the chapters surrounding the main commentary likely to be anywhere near as helpful to the student reader as Chapter 3 itself. The length of the two introductory chapters meant that Wicks did not have time to devote to significant intellectual contextualization in Chapter 1 as well as juicy biographical details. He does helpfully emphasize Schopenhauer's atheism (providing evidence from his extensive knowledge of Schopenhauer's unpublished writings). This distinguishes Schopenhauer nicely from his intellectual context, highlights Schopenhauer's uncompromising intellectual honesty, and may, in the US at least, give a frisson of excitement to students. But to make this claim striking involves some perhaps unnecessary simplification of Schopenhauer's immediate forebears. Wicks claims, for instance, that "Kant postulates as a moral certainty, a timeless, benevolent, supreme intelligence behind the natural scenes" (1). This is not inaccurate, but even a philosophical novice ought to be aware of the importance of Kant's critique of rational theology.

Chapter 2, the "Overview of Themes," and Chapter 4 ("Reception and Influence") I think suffered most from the constraints of the format. The overviews repeated what would be expanded upon in Chapter 3, but in a form so compressed as to be far from easy going (in fact, most of the best contextualizing work was done in the first section of Chapter 3, for instance Wicks's really nice and quite original little account of the 'organic' nature of Schopenhauer's self-described "single-thought"). Space constraints in Chapter 4 meant that Wicks has time in many cases only to enumerate the extensive list of authors who have been influenced by Schopenhauer without always being able to go into enough detail to justify the enumeration. This was particularly disappointing as Wicks has elsewhere given elaborate and stimulating accounts of Schopenhauer's relation to, for example, Nietzsche and Wittgenstein, as well as, more provocatively, Hegel. Still, there are definite moments of interest even there. For instance, Wicks describes Schopenhauer's crucial influence on Wagner, emphasizing the importance of musical suspensions like the famous 'Tristan chord' as analogons of the will; but then goes on to show that Schopenhauer's influence extends beyond Wagner into the atonality of Schoenberg's music -- despite Schopenhauer's own personal predilection for Rossini and Mozart (149f).

On a definitely minor note I did find some of Wicks's stylistic locutions off-putting: "causality, status-wise, compares to the forms of space and time" (56)! What is wrong with "causality has the same [or similar] status as the forms of space and time"? And I should also mention some small issues of translation. It is a pity that Wicks does not cite or refer to the new Cambridge translation of The World as Will and Representation which came out in 2010, unfortunately after Wicks had submitted his manuscript to Continuum (full disclosure: I am one of the translators). This is true in general, but also specifically there are a number of terms where Wicks could have been clearer about the relation between his English and Schopenhauer's German. He translates anschaulich (following Payne) as either 'intuitive' or 'perceptual' (e.g., 12). Without clear explanation, this can make it sound like Schopenhauer is using two terms as well, while also, not completely inappropriately, exploiting an aspect of the semantic field of the English term 'intuitive' (e.g., on 86 where Wicks describes artists as "intuitively connected" to metaphysical reality) that is not present in the German. The Cambridge edition also uses 'cognition' instead of 'knowledge' for Erkenntnis, and a word or two about the Erkenntnis/Wissen distinction in Schopenhauer's context might have been helped by this translation (e.g., at 57).

But these are very minor issues that should not detract from the really excellent job Wicks has done in pressing his deep scholarly knowledge of Schopenhauer into a form that is original, entertaining, and teacherly. If I have a criticism, it is that the form itself is too constraining -- even for its stated goals.