Science after the Practice Turn in the Philosophy, History, and Social Studies of Science

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Léna Soler, Sjoerd Zwart, Michael Lynch, and Vincent Israel-Jost (eds.), Science after the Practice Turn in the Philosophy, History, and Social Studies of Science, Routledge, 2014, 346pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415722957.

Reviewed by Alfred Nordmann, Technische Universität Darmstadt


Does anyone remember the time before the practice turn in the philosophy of science? Did social studies of science even exist before that turn? These opening questions sound polemical but are not to diminish, only to accentuate, a formidable collection of essays, each with a thoughtful response. It is a commonplace today and a widely shared commitment to study science not in the abstract but in practice. Accordingly, it is not easy to name the moment when the turn to practice took place, and it is worth asking what came before to warrant this turn.1

The editors as well as the contributors to this volume are well aware of the difficulty of defining a single moment and propose to speak of “practice trends” instead (p. 3). The difficulty is due in part to a tension between two lines of attack that can be associated with the “practice turn”:

I.   Many philosophers are not concerned with what scientists actually do but tend to mistake the scientists’ rational reconstructions for what they actually did.

II.  Philosophers study science as interested in theory, truth, propositions, or representations of the world, thereby underestimating experimentation, intervention, and the technical transformation of the world.

One will be hard-pressed to find the philosophers, historians, and social scientists who are guilty as charged on the first count. The pre-Kuhnian philosophers of science who promoted a wissenschaftliche Weltanschauung or demarcation criteria for science would not mistake their normative enterprise for the description of actual research practice — and this allowed them to pursue a socially relevant philosophy of science that critically engaged practice in science and society. Even when “rational reconstruction” was the name of the game (1960s to 1980s), it was an attempt to explain the actual practice of formulating and justifying hypotheses by way of theories of scientific rationality. This would suggest that the practice turn consists primarily in abandoning theories of practice. Is it the dismissal of theory, then, that accounts for the “practice” in “practice turn”? Hasok Chang’s contribution, in particular, will serve below as a testing ground for this characterization. Does piecemeal description of local procedures and strategies take the place even of middle-range theorizing? That this holds also for social studies of science can be seen in the discussion of Michael Lynch’s contribution.

As for the other line of attack, there are a great many practitioners of the practice turn who are themselves guilty as charged. Following Ian Hacking, they study the practice of theorizing and of representing the world. While they appreciate the role of instruments and experiments, they regard technological interventions as a means to the unquestioned goal of science,:theory and representation.2 The label “constructivism,” broadly conceived, designates their practice-oriented explanations, where the explanandum is, as it always was, the agreement between theory and reality.3 That leaves only a minority of philosophers of scientific practice who take the second charge more seriously. They consider science as a technology in its own right and view theories and models as a means in the pursuit of acquiring and demonstrating capabilities of control. Thus, when philosophers of science notice that familiar notions like representation, explanation, or lawfulness need to be reconceived in light of practice, are they still seeking to fit these notions into a conception of science as the pursuit of theory and reality, or are they reconceiving also the very idea of scientific knowledge production? This predicament is reflected in Andrea Woody’s and Joseph Rouse’s contributions.4

Might this be the somewhat sobering upshot of the practice turn — if we take it in the sense of (I), it is indiscernible except for its aversion to theorize scientific practice, and if we take it in the sense of (II) it is for the most part an unfulfilled promise?


The first claim is that rather than acknowledge, finally, what scientists actually do, the practice turn refrains from theorizing what scientists actually do. At first glance, Hasok Chang’s contribution contradicts this claim. It offers the outlines for “a philosophical grammar of scientific practice” that situates epistemic activities within systems of practice. Commenting on his paper, Léna Soler and Régis Catinaud offer a detailed critique that challenges Chang’s claim that his proposal constitutes “a structured and precise philosophical framework for thinking and talking about scientific practices” (pp. 67, 80-92). However, Chang and his critics might be talking past each other: what recommends Chang’s proposal is precisely that it is so very generic, that it is a framework for thinking and talking rather than a substantial theory of practice at all. His grammar assumes that actions are oriented towards purposes, functions, and aims, and that they seek coherence of operations, rules, and aims in the concert of multiple activities. This is meant to correct anemic conceptions of rational actors in analytic philosophy, and by the same token it does not add to extant grammars of action-talk, to John Dewey’s theory of inquiry, or to approaches from cognitive psychology such as Howard Gruber’s “networks of enterprise.”5 It takes work to maintain, collectively, a system of activity — and the maintenance of such systems would be a focus of study for the philosophy of scientific practice, not unlike the study after Kuhn and Lakatos of paradigms and research programmes, and not unlike actor-network-theory.

Chang’s grammar of scientific practice thus offers one of various ways to represent epistemic activities as meaningful in terms of their inherent purposes, their external functions, and the aims of their system of practice. Equally important, however, is what it does not do: it does not claim to be a superior way of representing practice, it does not promise that specific features of practice become visible that would otherwise remain obscure, and as a framework for representing the epistemic practice of all scientific knowledge-production, it does not distinguish between types of knowledge. Indeed, it is a strength and weakness at once of Chang’s proposal that it seeks to include as much as possible under the heading of “epistemic activity.” He defines it as a “set of mental and physical operations that are intended to contribute to the production or improvement of knowledge” but leaves open whether “knowledge” takes the form of theories or that of practical advances in soda manufacture (pp. 72 and 74).6

To be sure, it is hard to draw a line between a framework for representing practice and a substantive theory of practice that seeks to explain or evaluate how scientists act. Candidates for the latter might be logical empiricist conceptions that reject as metaphysical any reference to the intentions of scientists or the telos of the scientific enterprise. Marxist sociology of science, which prepared for the Edinburgh school’s sociology of scientific knowledge, might serve as another example, as does pragmatism with its emphasis on the doubt-belief dynamic and the resolution of conflict that lends coherence to any process of inquiry. If the analytic philosopher’s conception of agency is anemic in comparison to Chang’s, Chang’s systems of practice are anemic in comparison to any of these.

One can also discern a genuine theory of scientific practice in Robert K. Merton’s sociology of science, which for a long time served as poster-child for a conception of science that supposedly disregards what scientists actually do. This accusation refers to his identification of an ethos of science that included the norms of communism, universalism, disinterestedness, and organized skepticism.7 The supposition of these norms appeared to conflict with the fact that many scientists are interested rather than disinterested, for example. And rather than submit to the idea that there is no personal intellectual property in science, many scientists claim ownership. Merton’s sublime image of an ideal community appears to evaporate in confrontation with the facts of the matter. But the rather simplistic turn to practice as the summing up of what people actually do, misses out on the complicated fabric of practice and, in particular, on the practice-relevant tensions between an internalized ethos and the functional requirements of a rôle.8 Following Max Weber, Merton first studied how the very notion of science as a vocation was deeply infused with a Protestant ethic.9 And after elaborating the ethos of science, he went on to study the conflicts in practice between these norms and the need for recognition, for example, in disputes about the priority of discoveries.10 And following on Weber and Merton, Steven Shapin has investigated the profound transformation in recent years of the professional ethos of the scientist.11 Shapin thus presses the issue of how to conceive the role of science and scientists in contemporary society — and thus a question central to the practice of science, which does not hinge upon what scientists actually do in the laboratory. When Merton and Shapin contrast a Protestant and entrepreneurial ethos of science as a vocation, they articulate the normative theories of action that scientists actually use to represent what they actually do as conforming to or violating these norms.

In “From Normative to Descriptive and Back,” Michel Lynch produces an illuminating contrast to this discussion. He situates it by also raising the question of what happened in the practice turn to theories of science and of the scientist. Focusing on the claims by Harry Collins and Robert Evans that expertise derives from assessments of tacit knowledge, Lynch invites the reader to consider normative vs. descriptive approaches on the one hand, and theory-based vs. descriptive approaches on the other. Collins and Evans take a normative stance. This is due to the contested question of who may count as an expert and who may thus assume a position of power in particular contexts of deliberation. This is not a neutral question and therefore, according to Lynch, “STS research may lead us to the point where we take normative positions that are embedded in or directed towards the settings under study” (p. 111). Collins and Evans ground their stance in a theory of tacit knowledge that provides expertise about expertise and allows Science Studies researchers to identify actors who possess the required kind of interactional expertise.

Lynch does not go along with their claim (p. 107), nor with their general proposal that the normative claims of STS can be grounded by moving back from being descriptive to being theory-based again. “STS research may lead us . . . to take normative positions . . . but these positions are not grounded in generalized STS concepts, typologies, or theories” (p. 111). Only by gaining, through description, “an intimate understanding of the practices studied” might STS research assume a normative stance (p. 111). For the practice turn, in other words, there is no way back to a Mertonian first wave of Science Studies. The return to a theory-based normativity is blocked not because scientific practice can be accounted for only descriptively, but because it is difficult, if not impossible for the critical endeavor of Science Studies to claim for itself the status of a science with expertise about expertise. According to Lynch, the problem is with Collins and Evans seeking to settle the question of their real expertise about expertise “by themselves on the basis of their analytical judgments” whereas the practice turn would demand that they leave this question “open to determination by participants and procedures in the institutions that social scientists investigate” (p. 105).


The practice turn provides intimate understanding of specific systems of practice. Rather than emphatically discovering practice that has previously been ignored, it is for good reasons averse to theory and the messy business of reconciling theories of science with descriptions of specific actual practice.12 And yet, there is reason to worry that this turn to practice remains blind to science as practice by taking a very superficial view of epistemic activities and what it means “to contribute to the production or improvement of knowledge” (p. 72). In the chapters by Andrea Woody and Joseph Rouse, one can witness the extent to which even the most reflective advocates of the practice turn are bewitched by an image of science that holds them captive.

Woody’s “Chemistry’s Periodic Law: Rethinking Representation and Explanation After the Turn to Practice” begins with Ian Hacking’s Representing and Intervening and shows how much work needs to be done from where Hacking leaves off. Hacking’s experimental realism, Woody argues, entrenched a dualism between theory and experiment: “Whereas experiment was conceptualized as practice, theory essentially was not” (p. 124, compare p. 9). This then indicates the direction for further research, namely to show how theory can be conceptualized as practice, her case in point being chemistry’s periodic table. She then works out persuasively how the periodic table works in contexts of representation and explanation. Finally, she establishes that her concern with the practice of theory makes a contribution to the practice turn.

All of this is compelling, and yet her line of reasoning leaves unquestioned another limitation of Hacking’s approach, and conceivably, by questioning this limit as well, she might have arrived at a less strained and even more compelling account of the periodic table as chemical practice. The unquestioned limitation of Hacking’s book becomes discernible when one amends Woody’s succinct synopsis: whereas Hacking presents experimentation as an interventionist practice of representation, he considers theoretical representation as conceptual — and while entrenching thus a dualism between theory and experiment, he also holds fast to the traditional view that technology is strictly subservient to the single aim of science, namely to represent stable features of the world, whether by way of theory or in an accomplished experimental set-up. Hacking’s original achievement was to establish that not just theories but also experiments provide scientific representations of phenomena.13 But surely, a turn to science as practice will not limit experimental practice to its representational function. On the contrary, it will take Hacking’s slogan that “experiments have a life of their own” to now include within the epistemic activities of science the production and improvement of working knowledge, that is, of knowledge of the ways in which things can be made to do work. As opposed to representational knowledge, working knowledge does not consist in statements about the world but is demonstrated by way of robust capabilities for putting things to work.14

How might such an insight inform Woody’s discussion of the periodic table? It would ease the burden of needing to accommodate her account of the periodic table within more or less received notions of representation, explanation, and lawfulness, opening up instead new avenues of understanding the periodic table as a tool for chemical action. The perceived need to somehow reconcile the periodic table with the supposedly exclusive aim of science to provide representations comes across in formulations like this: “If we believe there is something fundamentally distinctive about representation in science, why assume that it is located in the representing relation itself rather than in the concrete social practices of representation cultivated by scientific communities?” (p. 146) The sentence’s opening “if we believe” suggests that one might be better off not believing this. As it stands, however, the ensuing account of the concrete social practices of representation overtaxes the notion of “representation”: the periodic table represents in non-propositional form features of the world (periodicity, specific information about the elements), it represents relations of similarity and difference by way of physical proximity and distance, it represents possibilities of action, e.g., by predicting properties and the existence of new elements, it represents patterns as being robust, it represents choices about modes of visualization. Here, it might be more productive to argue that the strictly representational features of the periodic table summarize propositional knowledge about chemical elements, whereas its presentational features produce an artefactual knowledge that allows working with chemical stuff. Two kinds of scientific knowledge production thus come together, as the periodic table refers not only to the basic elements from which all existing things are composed, but as a toolbox for the creation of novelty refers also to what things might become: “cancer drugs, household plastics, agricultural pesticides, and nanoparticle-laced sunscreens” (p. 144)15

Viewing the production of representational knowledge as only one type of scientific knowledge production opens the door for analyzing the periodic table as chemical working knowledge. And once alternative conceptions of epistemic activity are available, familiar epistemic categories take on different meanings. What it means to understand something, to observe, to experiment, or to explain is different for the production of representational explanation and for the production of working knowledge. Propositional and representational explanations, for example, show that a phenomenon occurs as a matter of course or situate it within a conceptual order. In contrast, the ability to recreate or rebuild a phenomenon in a simulation model can also be explanatory insofar as it is indicative of having working knowledge of the dynamic that produces that phenomenon. Along such lines Woody proposes that the periodic table is explanatory by way of providing a “functional perspective” that orients the discipline and conditions reasoning towards the production of novelty (p. 144).16

Woody sets out to show how theory can be conceptualized as practice and in doing so takes care to keep in place all the standard features of a scientific theory that might be lawful, that involves representation and supports explanation. However, when articulating these notions for the periodic table as chemical practice, she needs to expand or alter their original meaning, thus running up against the limitations imposed by conceptions of epistemic activity and systems of practice as oriented exclusively to the aim of representation. By running up against a view of science as interested in theory, truth, propositions, or representations of the world, Woody shows that it requires a non-trivial effort to turn away from this view and toward another view of science as a technological practice that establishes basic capabilities of intervention, manipulation, visualization, modelling, or demonstrating what things can do.


The practice turn attends to what scientists actually do. But what is it that scientists do when they follow their routines in the laboratory, prepare samples, perform an experiment, record observations, create a computer model, collate and publish their findings? They might be doing all this and we still do not know whether they are testing a hypothesis or expanding their capabilities of control, or both — and we also do not know whether they are using technology as a tool to improve their theories, or whether they are using theories as tools to further their technological reach. If what scientists actually do unfolds within different systems of practice with different epistemic activities to produce different kinds of knowledge, the question is no longer what scientists actually do but what scientists are.

It is here that the book’s title demands special notice. Science After the Practice Turn suggests that science itself may have changed during those last few decades that also witnessed the practice turn in the philosophy of science. And indeed, one might suspect a common cause for new conceptions of what scientists are and new ways of studying what scientists do: Science Studies debunks mythical views of science and attends to practices and techniques during a time when science takes on ever more openly the role of driver of technological innovation rather than vanguard of Enlightenment ideas. Thus, what science is might change not because practices change but because it is valued differently as a cultural institution — similar to the way that the meaning of art has changed.

In the penultimate chapter, Joseph Rouse takes on the challenge showing how the practice turn has changed what we mean by science. He shows that science does not just operate within a certain niche in which particular standards of argument and evidence hold, but how it constructs that niche. The practice turn takes a naturalist approach to scientific niche production; it is thus a science of science. Rouse’s view differs sharply from Chang’s in that the intentionality of epistemic activity takes a backseat: “Even though scientific concepts and theories aim to makes sense of the world as we find it, their proximate application is typically to the world as we make it” (p. 281). Science provides conceptual understanding and not working knowledge, but instead of serving the aim of representation, conceptual understanding allows us to inhabit a world of our making. The practice turn affords a naturalistic perspective on this form of habitation. By situating understanding within a biological context (p. 289), Rouse thus reframes the received view of science with its intellectual conception of just one kind of epistemic activity.

I have argued that the practice turn would be meaningless if it merely fetishized “what scientists actually do.” Implicitly or explicitly, Chang’s formal grammar of practices becomes instantiated if not by theories then at least by substantial conceptions of scientific practice. Without them one could not see what scientists are doing when they are doing something. But once one begins filling in the empty formalism of epistemic-activity-in-a-system-of-practice, one encounters alternatives: in light of Shapin’s analysis, can we attribute to a community of research professionals a Weberian or Mertonian notion of science as a vocation? Are some particular researchers in their lab using technology to produce an empirically adequate theoretical description, or are they using available theory to extend their technological reach and produce working knowledge in the form of a proof of concept? Or shall we abandon Chang’s framework of intentional epistemic activity altogether and ask, instead, how those particular researchers in their lab are creating a niche in which they can reproduce the way of life that is shaped through their conceptual work? What is at stake with all these questions is not what scientists do but whether their practice is intellectual or technological.

1 There are suggestions that the practice turn should be traced back all the way to Kuhn (pp. 5 and 42) — with few philosophers of science working today whose training was untouched by the general post-Kuhnian commitment to history of science, the investigation of case studies, and a focus on the special sciences.

2 Hacking’s Representing and Intervening is often cited as the book that started the practice turn. But his “philosophy of scientific experimentation” or “New Experimentalism” remains committed to representation as the goal of science, with technology subservient to this goal. In their introduction, the editors acknowledge this limitation and explicitly seek to push Hacking further than he was willing to go at the time (p. 22).

3 See the editors’ introduction and Michael Lynch’s perceptive overview (pp. 13 and 96). Of all the theoretical debates that informed the conflict between philosophy of science and the sociology of scientific knowledge (SSK) in the 1980s, only a vaguely construed “(social) constructivism” survived the “mangle of practice” and emerged as the label for an a-theoretical theory of science. However, “constructivism” along with “realism,” “idealism,” and “instrumentalism” is only one among several theories competing to explain apparent scientific achievements of agreement between theory and reality. Outside this explanatory context the notion of “constructivism” fails to do any work.

4 I apologize to Jean-Michel Salanskis, Hanne Andersen, Louis Bucciarelli and Peter Kroes, Jean Paul van Bendegem, and Karine Chemla for neglecting to discuss their contributions, which illuminate specific dimensions of the practice turn.

5 Howard Gruber “Networks of enterprise in creative scientific work,” in B. Gholson, W.R. Shadish, R.A. Neimeyer, A.C. Houts (eds.) Psychology of Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989, pp. 246-266. Chang’s concluding statement applies equally to Dewey’s theory of inquiry, except that Dewey brings in the richer notion of experience: “When the ‘practice turn’ in science studies recognized science as practice, we came to recognize more clearly the continuity between science and the rest of life” (p. 77).

6 Chang gently insinuates on p. 74 that many scientific communities are today held together by the inherent purpose of seeking understanding while, simultaneously, satisfying the external function of creating useful things. This, to be sure, would be an instance of studying not what scientists actually do but believing at face value what scientists often say they do.

7 Robert K. Merton, “The Normative Structure of Science,” in R.K. Merton, The Sociology of Science: Theoretical and Empirical Investigations, Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1973, pp. 267-278.

8 To be sure, Chang’s a-theoretical grammar of practices can provide a framework for accounts like Merton’s, especially as regards the difficulties of maintaining coherence between inherent purposes and external functions.

9 Robert K. Merton “Science, Technology and Society in Seventeenth Century England”, Osiris, Vol. IV, pt. 2, 1938, pp. 360-632. 

10 Merton, “The Ambivalence of Scientists,” in The Sociology of Science, pp. 383-412. After appreciating Merton’s understanding of the discrepancy between scientific practice and its rational reconstructions, Lynch nevertheless goes on to claim that Merton “did not endeavor to describe actual practice in close detail” (pp. 101f.). This indicates that we do not recognize anymore in the paper on scientists’ handling of ambivalence a close description of scientific practice.

11 Steven Shapin, The Scientific Life: A Moral History of a Late Modern Vocation, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2008.

12 The good reasons are self-exemplifying. STS scholars shy away from subsuming practice under theory because subsumption is a scientific practice that needs to be problematized. In a similarly self-exemplifying manner the philosophical discussions of models and modelling in science are less afraid to tackle those difficulties. Though working with general accounts of modelling, they can hardly be accused of ignoring what scientists actually do in specific systems of practice. Models are mediators, after all, and what actually takes place is neither reduced nor flattened out just because it is being related to theory.

13 What was thought to be the exclusive domain of theory in science is now also within the grasp — unaided by theory — of experiment. But Hacking paid a considerable price for conceiving of experimentation as a form of representation. His imagined scenario of early humans engaged in representation even before they had language explicitly excludes that homo faber might carve a sculpture for purposes of ritual, but acknowledges only homo depictor who creates a likeness. See Ian Hacking, Representing and Intervening, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983, p. 135.

14 This allusion to working knowledge can only indicate a general direction of research in the philosophy of technoscience. See Alfred Nordmann “Object lessons: towards an epistemology of technoscience,” scientia studiae: Revista Latino-Americana de Filosofia e História da Ciência, vol. 10, special issue, 2012, pp. 11-31.

15 To be sure, the following proposal is well-meaning at best by indicating how life could be easier if one abandons the notion that scientific knowledge production aims exclusively for representations of the world. It is another question entirely whether, for example, the suggested juxtaposition of representational and presentational features is adequate for understanding the history of the periodic table.

16 Similarly, Woody argues for the law-like status of the periodic table by shifting the meaning of lawfulness to include “the normative status of the generalization, earned through its utility in practice” (p. 148)