Science and Ethics

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Bernard E. Rollin, Science and Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 292pp., $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521857546.

Reviewed by Clark Wolf, Iowa State University


The myth of scientific objectivity and impartiality is hard to shake, though we have known for a long time how deeply ideals and prejudices can be embedded in scientific theories. Philosophers of science have long accepted that scientists are human beings, prone to the same frailties and weaknesses of judgment that afflict the rest of us. These human weaknesses often express themselves in the professional statements of scientists and sometimes even in the structure of scientific theories. It can be argued that scientists themselves have mostly been slower to accept this fact, and slower than one might wish to appreciate its implications for the practice of science and the training of scientists. The most serious problems arise when unreflective prejudice or bias inappropriately express themselves in the scientific process. The history of science is full of interesting side-shows that we now understand in these terms: examples where unreflective prejudice and ideology exerted inappropriate epistemic influence. Because of this, it has become clear that many important issues in the philosophy of science are inextricably bound to issues in the history of science. To accommodate this, many departments have turned the study of the 'philosophy of science' into the study of 'the history and philosophy of science.'

Ideology may express itself in ways other than directly biased science. It can inform the way research projects are chosen, the way researchers conduct themselves in the research process, and the way in which research is used or misused in practice. Bernard Rollin's book Science and Ethics focuses our attention on ethical issues that arise in each of these contexts. But unlike most works in the philosophy of science, Rollin is primarily concerned with the application of scientific research, and with the research process itself, less (at least in this work) with the structure of scientific theories. Because Rollin has spent decades of his professional life working closely with researchers, developing standards for the treatment of research subjects, teaching and writing on bioethics, and especially on veterinary medical ethics, he is in a uniquely good position to discuss these issues.

Science and Ethics includes ten chapters, each of which has been written so that it can stand on its own, read independently from the rest of the book. This makes it a convenient book for use in class, since one might easily pick and choose chapters to include in class without covering the entire work. Indeed, the book appears to have been designed with such use in mind. It is written in a clear and engaging style, and material is presented in a way that makes it accessible to non-philosophers who may not have a background in ethical theory or in the philosophy of science. But the chapters are also tightly linked and constitute a sustained argument that will be missed by readers who pick and choose from among them. While it is written to be accessible to students and nonspecialists, this is no textbook. It is a sustained and original contribution to the ethics of scientific practice. Taken together the chapters constitute a persuasive and tightly linked argument.

Topics covered range from the treatment of research subjects, consideration of objections to genetic engineering, stem cell research, cloning, xenotransplantation, and the integrity of the research process. The first chapters may be understood to set the program for the more topical discussions that follow. Two themes are prominent: First, Rollin offers a theory of the relationship between the development of new science and technology, and the (generally) subsequent development of social and ethical norms governing their use. He argues that we should not be surprised to find that technological and scientific change are often greeted with suspicion on the part of the public, since the social and ethical implications of technological change are rarely understood until we have lived with a new technology for some time. Second, Rollin emphasizes ways in which the unreflective beliefs and commitments of scientists often skew the practice of science and the use of research results. Because much of Rollin's own work has focused on medicine and veterinary science, he is particularly concerned with contexts in which ideological commitments have led researchers and physicians astray in these areas.

Rollin's discussion of pain is an especially interesting example of this emphasis. The topic is discussed in different contexts in several different parts of the book, and has been the focus of a significant portion of Rollin's other work. He argues that scientists and physicians regularly fail to take into account the moral and the scientific significance of pain in research and treatment. An example makes this clear: Much preliminary work on anesthesia was done on animal models, incorporating the implicit assumption that the mechanics of pain relief in animals and humans will be largely similar. Rollin documents that many researchers who performed this important research were (or professed to be) skeptical about animal consciousness and about the ability of animals to experience subjective mental states like pain. Some of the sources of this skepticism may be strategic rather than epistemic: researchers who are involved in experiments using animal models often feel that they are under attack, and are at pains to defend the practice of animal experimentation using any means at their disposal.

In the case of pain research, denial that animals can experience pain is especially problematic and paradoxical. Animals can be appropriately used to model human beings only where their capacities are relevantly similar to those of humans. So if animals could not experience pain, then they would be inappropriate models for the study of human pain or for the study of anesthesia and analgesia. Because many scientists view themselves as having an unequivocal obligation to defend the propriety of animal research, but are engaged in research that depends upon the use of non-human animal models to develop products for application in medical practice on human beings, some appear to have adopted the paradoxical view that animals do not experience pain, but are nonetheless appropriate models for human pain.

These conflicting commitments came into sharp focus when regulations governing the treatment of research animals were developed. Rollin is in an excellent position to comment on this situation since he was working closely with veterinarians and animal scientists at the time when these regulations were put in place, and because he was influential in framing federal regulations governing the treatment of laboratory animals. The regulations in question require anesthesia and pain relief whenever research involves invasive treatment of animals. Rollin reports that when this legislation was under discussion, veterinarians argued that they didn't know how to control animal pain, and were even skeptical that animals could experience pain. When Rollin urged that "this is why we need laws," they responded: "You're begging the question … you can't say we need laws until you have demonstrated that rats feel pain." (119) Rollin continues this story in a narrative mode:

Half a dozen years later, after the laws had passed and gone into effect, I called one of the veterinarians who had been on the panel. "Well," I said, "you were agnostic about pain at the AALAS symposium. But now you must use analgesia. What would you use after the crush experiment on the rat?" To my surprise, he rattled off a series of analgesic modalities. Surprised, I said "How do you know that now?" "Easy," he said, "We simply went to the drug companies." "What do you mean?" I said. "Drug companies don't develop analgesia for rats." "No," he said. "But all human analgesics for years have been tested on rats. I just retrieved the data." Although he knew this in the early 1980s, it was only the passage of the laws that caused him to shift his gestalt and to see that data as relevant to rat pain. (119)

This appears to be a classic example of the way in which unexamined ideological assumptions can inappropriately skew the practice of science. The ideological denial that animals experience pain has had other important effects on research and veterinary practice: Until quite recently it was usual for researchers to use immobilizing drugs -- drugs like curare, which prevent movement without providing any pain relief at all. In research and veterinary practice, such drugs were regularly used for invasive surgical and experimental procedures. Today, due in part to Rollin's influence on federal guidelines governing laboratory practice, the use of curareform drugs in such contexts would never pass review by an Animal Care and Use Committee unless a researcher could decisively demonstrate that it was necessary for the research under consideration. Even then there would be a strong presumption against approval, and any researcher planning such a project would be obliged to provide the strongest argument to justify the proposal.

It is not only veterinarians and researchers who have neglected the problem of pain. Evidence suggests that human physicians are also prone to overlook the significance of pain and suffering, at least when they are convinced that these psychological states will not interfere with the physical healing process. Where analgesics are used, Rollin documents that the choice of which drug to use may also be influenced by considerations that should be irrelevant. The drug ketamine was "heralded as the 'ideal' anesthetic, since overdose was virtually impossible, and it did not cause respiratory depression." (228) But while ketamine seemed to be successful for some people to whom it was given, others reported horrifying experiences of dissociation and anguish -- 'bad trips' -- under the influence of this drug. For this reason (and others, as Rollin reports on p. 230) it was mostly abandoned in favor of preferable alternatives. Years after it had been abandoned, Rollin discovered that it was still being used in the mid-1980s "on the very young (children) and the very old (the elderly)." (231) Rollin reports that he discovered that the continued use of ketamine in these populations was not because the undesirable effects of ketamine were less prevalent in these groups. Rather it was because children and the elderly were relatively powerless, so their pain and discomfort were discounted.

One might object that these are stories, not arguments. But in the context of Rollin's book, they exemplify a crucial point: they demonstrate the role of ideology in the practice of science and medicine. And in the philosophy of science, stories of change and progress (in this case) are often crucial to our understanding of our own situation. It is especially important for physicians and veterinarians to understand changes in attitudes toward pain and pain relief, because it promotes critical self-reflection about present practices. Rollin's own work has had a decisive influence on scientific practice, especially concerning the treatment of research subjects. The fact that he has been so effective in influencing scientific practice may substantially reflect the fact that he has taken the time to acquaint himself with the recent history of research and veterinary practice -- the stories that lie behind present practices. But they are important stories that may lead to changes in practice. There is good evidence that inadequate and inappropriate treatment for pain is a problem that characterizes present medical practice. Rollin's 'stories' about the use of ketamine and about the practices that have led to systematically inadequate treatment of pain by physicians and veterinarians should rationally persuade practitioners to re-think their own practices and to be critical of the status quo. If this book had that effect, it would by itself constitute a greater practical impact than most work in philosophy can hope to achieve.

Not all topics considered in this book are covered with equal care: A single thirty-page chapter covers cloning, xenotransplantation, and stem cell research. While this provides space to present each of these issues, Rollin's brief treatment is by no means exhaustive. In effect, he briefly explains the moral problem involved in each of these issues, identifies common but problematical arguments that people have raised with respect to them, and briefly responds. His discussion clears away some spurious objections and flummery, but leaves many important issues only lightly touched. One need not regard this as a critical objection to Rollin's work, only a remark about it. While three chapters are devoted to different aspects of biotechnology, it would take much more than the allotted 86 pages to give full coverage of the interesting issues raised in this area. In particular, Rollin's treatment of biotechnology gives little attention to environmental and ecological concerns and instead treats the intrinsic or religious objections, or objections based on 'unnaturalness.' From the perspective of the field, the arguments of these chapters may pick the 'low hanging fruit,' providing sensible responses to common objections without providing anything like an exhaustive treatment of the relevant ethical concerns. But as in other chapters, Rollin effectively exposes the influence of ideology on science, and on popular responses to new technologies. While he emphasizes the need for ethics to "catch up" to scientific and technological change, he also exposes the common tendency to resist new technologies just because they are new and unfamiliar.

Overall, this book is an exceptionally useful contribution to the philosophy of science, and to the field of bioethics. It could be used in its entirety as a text in courses on ethics and biotechnology or on the responsible conduct of research. (I have taken my own recommendation, and plan to use it in my course next Spring.) Portions would be appropriate for general courses in the philosophy of science or medical or veterinary medical ethics. The engaging writing style and the mode of argumentation through story telling will make it appropriate and appealing even for students who have little experience in philosophy. For professional philosophers and researchers, it provides an excellent example of how philosophical work can be engaging, articulate, and directly applicable to scientific practice.