Science and Other Cultures: Issues in Philosophy of Science and Technology

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Figueroa, Robert and Harding, Sandra (eds.), Science and Other Cultures: Issues in Philosophy of Science and Technology, Routledge, 2003, 265pp, $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415939925.

Reviewed by Peter J. Taylor , University of Massachusetts, Boston


This collection of essays leaves me at once jealous, refreshed, and wanting more. Jealous because the collection represents the work of scholars who have moved against the mainstream in their field—philosophy of science—yet had an opportunity to do so with funding and endorsement. The essays represent one product from a National Science Foundation grant to the American Philosophical Association in 2000-1 for a series of summer research projects and conference presentations on diversity issues in the philosophy of science.

Refreshed by the topics addressed by these philosophers, which are diverse and grounded in fascinating, real-world cases. Let me review the range: controversy over the use of placebos in a clinical trial of low-cost prevention of mother-to-baby HIV transmission in poor countries; the inquiry of Blanche in Barbara Neely’s murder mystery as an illustration of the epistemological importance of standpoint; the significance of multicultural and postcolonial science studies; the conquest-era Nahuatl ideal of inquiry as one of humans maintaining balance as they walk on the “slippery surface” of the earth; comparison of the socio-cultural nexus around use of transgenic seeds versus agro-ecological methods; official versus local views about monitoring of medical after-effects of Marshall Islanders’ exposure to H-bomb tests; appropriate legal frameworks for preventing discrimination based on genetic information; application of MacIntyre’s idea of “flourishing” in thinking about people with mental disabilities; the blurred boundary between cosmetic surgery and restoration of functioning; socioeconomic and ethnic biases in standard tests for mental flexibility; geographical considerations as prior to any biological claims about race; circularity in explanation of the exceptionality of homosexual behavior in animals; and Japan and Japanese scholars providing alternative, non-Western models of modernization and globalization as they interact with specific national contexts.

Wanting more books of such variety, which will contribute to a culture of science criticism as vigorous as we already expect for art, literature, movies, architecture—preferably even more vigorous. After all, science is a dominant institution in Western societies and in their interactions with other cultures. Surely it ought to be strong enough to accommodate a diversity of commentary and angles on the process and products of science.

Yet there was another sense in which the book left me wanting more. I wanted the wonderful material in the essays to yield more philosophical resources to help in engaging with sciences. My interpretation is that these (and other) philosophers of science need to explore the diverse practical considerations that arise when scientists and other social agents attempt to modify specific instances of knowledge making. Let me use one essay to illustrate this interpretation and then comment briefly on some other essays in this light.

Robert Crease’s essay, “Fallout,” centers on medical research conducted for forty years by the Brookhaven National Laboratory to assess the health of Marshall Islanders after their exposure to radiation from the 1954 hydrogen bomb test in the Bikini atoll. During the 1960s the annual check-ups by the researchers expanded to include some (unauthorized) provision of health care, but the brief visits did not attempt to bridge the language or cultural gap or bring benefits back to the Islanders. During the 1970s a conjunction of factors engendered resistance to the research. Thyroid abnormalities emerged; Japanese antinuclear activists made contact with local politicians, Peace Corps volunteers encouraged the Islanders to demand better medical treatment, and the idea gained currency that the original exposure and subsequent lack of medical care was deliberate with Marshall Islanders as scientific guinea pigs. By 1996 an official declaration of the Marshallese parliament declared that “diabetes and cataracts” were “irrefutably presumed to be the result of the Nuclear Testing Program” (cited on p. 121). No credibility was given to research that refuted that connection and attributed the diabetes to the increasing dependence on canned foods that has followed the relocations of the Islanders since the tests. Crease laments the skepticism about the medical research: “social activism in [a] volatile situation”… means that science “ceas[es] to inform practical action” (p. 122). To avoid this, Western researchers, he implies, need to be especially careful “in interactions with socially vulnerable populations and colonial environments” (p. 122).

I agree with Crease’s call for cultural sensitivity, but want to argue that more mileage for philosophy of science can be gained from this case. Lest there be any confusion, I accept the idea that knowledge claims have varying degrees of fidelity to the situations they purport to explain. Suppose, however, we focus on what makes the knowledge claims significant to those that develop them. From this angle, the attitudes to science from both sides depend on a social context. The Marshallese come to believe that they are being used for medical research without their benefit, and the Brookhaven scientists believed that the results of regular monitoring provide useful insight into the health effects of radiation. The Marshallese belief became significant for them when they began to assert a political voice and develop a movement narrative to respond to the power of the American State. The Brookhaven researchers, funded by that State, took the significance of increased scientific knowledge for granted—along the lines of the long-standing, enlightenment narrative they could believe that discovering more about observable phenomena is worthwhile in itself. In practice, however, this does not always turn out to be the case. For example, in the United States Goldberger’s investigations during the 1910s linked the disease pellagra to deficiencies in diet. Nothing was made of Goldberger’s correct findings and they did not play a part in the eradication of the disease. Pellagra disappeared in the United States when the diets of the poor improved during the New Deal and mobilization for World War II. Indeed, until the Federal government assumed such a role in job creation and income support, it was difficult for most people to envisage what significance could be given to Goldberger’s findings (Chase 1977).

An important question is opened up once we acknowledge that the significance of knowledge depends on the social context in which it is produced: What would it take in practice to change the knowledge of either side? Consider the admirable work done by an ecologist, Jan Naidu, who, Crease tells us, was hired in 1978 to monitor the environment and dietary exposure of the Marshallese. Naidu lived with the Marshallese, learned their language, hosted nightly conversations, earned their respect, and gradually developed ways of explaining the relevant science. If this had continued, the views of both sides about what knowledge was significant could well have developed into a position of mutual appreciation. But after one year the funds for Naidu’s work were redirected into a program that produced colorful brochures. What would it have taken in practice for the Marshallese to influence funding decisions that occur far away from the Islands? It is unusual but not unknown for marginal people to bridge such gaps, to make the distant part of their scope and get involved in shaping the direction of scientific research. But reconstruction of science from the margins is never a simple matter; there is always a complex confluence of processes and conjunction of circumstances involved (e.g., Arditti 1999, 69ff).

It might seem more straightforward for the Brookhaven researchers to have secured the continuation of Naidu’s work. Yet they were involved in establishing general results about radiation biology; they had built careers, skills, collaborations, access to publishing outlets, and so on that supported this emphasis. It would not have been a simple matter for them to shift their priorities to assist the Marshallese make local knowledge (Harvey 1995). Individual will, morality, political commitment, or ideology may help motivate scientists to attempt to change knowledge that has social significance, but in my experience—first as an agricultural and environmental scientist, then in analyzing and interpreting the dynamics of science—there are always diverse practical considerations that have to be addressed (Taylor 1995).

Crease ends by appealing to readers’ desire to “do justice to the memory of the exposed victims” and concluding that we need to ensure that scientifically produced knowledge is not prevented from informing social action. If we take this as a starting point, the challenge would be to identify multiple points at which scientists could in practice engage differently to try to modify the knowledge produced and its significance. Whether any specific modifications are achievable depends on the position and resources of the specific scientists as they enter into negotiations with other relevant social agents. Shedding light on this may seem to be a project for sociology of science, but the interaction of multiple, diverse conditions also raises difficult issues about causality and explanation that invite more attention from philosophers (see appendices of Taylor 1995).

Politics of science is also implied by the idea of teasing out multiple points of engagement, for it suggests that many different agents are jointly and partially responsible for making change. The authors in this collection foster a different view of democratizing science, one that relies on oppositions or differences among cultures. Lacey’s essay, for example, highlights the divide between agriculture employing genetically modified varieties and traditional agro-ecological strategies. Challenging the hegemonic “socio-cultural nexus” that gives a value to transgenic seeds is a matter of “solidarity with poor people whose movements are struggling to recover and enhance their personal and communal agency” (p. 102). Lacey’s dichotomy, however, leaves no place conceptually or politically for other alternatives, such as plant-breeding research that uses conventional (pre-genetic engineering) methods to generate new varieties suitable for specific regional or local environmental conditions. From personal experience in such agricultural research, I learned that securing support involves negotiations among scientists and other social agents that are more complicated than what can be captured by notions of hegemony and solidarity.

There are rhetorical and expository advantages in philosophers using readily demarcated oppositions, which this collection’s authors tend to do when they juxtapose dominant science with knowledge claims of the colonized, subaltern, marginal, or insurgent. The result is a valuable countercurrent to mainstream philosophy of science, but I think that deeper challenges would flow from building analyses that address the wider arenas of practice in which scientific ideas become significant. In this vein, Maffie’s account of the Nahuatl’s ideal of inquiry might have considered not only the ideal, but their actual practice—after all, most Western scientists advocate the scientific method, but this provides little insight into what questions get asked and what answers get taken up. Hood’s account of “activist science” might have played down the ethical dilemmas of using placebos in clinical trials and instead focused on how to develop the multitude of non-clinical interventions needed to stem HIV transmission and address its ramifications on livelihoods and human relationships. Wylie might have been less satisfied with the murder-mystery analogy she used to illustrate the importance of standpoint—in real life, there is not necessarily a “who done it?” to arrive at by the end. Moreover, oppression can occlude people’s intelligence; it does not always—the success of the fictional Blanche notwithstanding--guarantee insight unavailable from other standpoints. And so on.

Of course, it is too easy to make suggestions about what authors might have written. Let me affirm my earlier assessment that Science and Other Cultures enriches an emerging culture of science criticism. At the same time, the book leaves me wondering what it would take in practice for questions about engaging with science to find a firmer place in either mainstream or alternative cultures of philosophy of science.


Arditti, R. (1999). Searching for Life: The Grandmothers of the Plazo de Mayo and the Disappeared Children of Argentina. Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.

Chase, A. (1977). “False Correlations = Real Deaths,” pp. 201-225 in The Legacy of Malthus. New York, NY: Alfred A. Knopf.

Harvey, D. (1995). “Militant particularism and global ambition: The conceptual politics of place, space, and environment in the work of Raymond Williams.” Social Text 42: 69-98.

Taylor, P. J. (1995). “Building on construction: An exploration of heterogeneous constructionism, using an analogy from psychology and a sketch from socio-economic modeling.” Perspectives on Science 3(1): 66-98.