Science and Partial Truth: A Unitary Approach to Models and Scientific Reasoning

Placeholder book cover

da Costa, Newton C.A., and French, Steven, Science and Partial Truth: A Unitary Approach to Models and Scientific Reasoning, Oxford, 2003, 272pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 019515651X.

Reviewed by Barbara Tuchanska, University of Lodz, Poland


I welcome Newton C. A. da Costa and Steven French’s Science and Partial Truth as an important contribution to a more realistic though--unavoidably--more fuzzy philosophy of science than all “received views.” In the first chapter they refer to Tarski’s conception of truth-as-correspondence and launch their own concept of “pragmatic or quasi truth,” formalized with the help of two notions: a partial structure A, within which S is quasi true, and a total structure B, within which S is true in the Tarskian sense. In the second chapter they opt for a model-theoretic approach to theories and in following chapters they apply the concepts of quasi truth and partial structures to several issues central for philosophy of science: models and isomorphism (chap. 3); beliefs, acceptance, and commitment (chap.4); inconsistency of theories (chap. 5); structural incompleteness of theories, their development, and its “structural engines” (chap. 6); induction (chap. 7); idealizational terms, existence claims, skeptical doubts, and (the) realist-antirealist debate (chap. 8). In the last chapter a prospective application of their framework to explanation, representation, and nonscientific beliefs is outlined.

Da Costa and French’s replacement of (absolute) truth-as-correspondence with quasi truth, which is only partial, is a sound and realistic move because the concept of quasi truth is more apt to (scientific) representations, which are always imperfect, that is, ambiguous, or idealized, or incomplete, etc. The concept of quasi truth carries out a pragmatist intention: it refers to the conception of an object that is “an epistemic totality,” and not to a single proposition (pp. 12, 101). When applying it to science they emphasize that regarding theories as partially true “captures the epistemic attitudes of scientists themselves” (p. 59). They unify neatly the concept of partial truth with that of a partial structure, within which “the relations and operations are defined for only some of the elements of the domain” (p. 19), and employ both within the model-theoretic approach to theories (p. 28). Theories are characterized in terms of classes of models represented by partial structures, and they are objects of epistemic attitudes, in particular, they are regarded as (quasi) true (p. 34, 49). One of the advantages of the model-theoretic approach is the fact that through partial structures “the openness of scientific practice can be represented” (p. 52). The concept of partial structures allows Da Costa and French to talk about partial isomorphism between families of relations belonging to different models (p. 49), and to account for proximate nature of models and their diversity.

Fortunately, Da Costa and French do not hold form above content, and the key “technical” terms they introduce are not formally overdone, but some concepts accompanying them, such as “to present,” “to represent,” “to characterize,” “to express,” are annoyingly unclear and confusingly applied simultaneously to the relationship between theories and models, between models themselves, and between models and the world (pp. 19, 33-4, 49, 57).

Employing the conception of partial structures to the analysis of beliefs, acceptance, and commitment, Da Costa and French go beyond the standard opposition: either to accept theory if it is believed to be true or empirically adequate or to separate acceptance from beliefs (pp. 62-3). In order to clarify what does it mean to believe a theory to be “partially true only” they mobilize Sperber’s idea of semipropositional representations that are partial, i.e., conceptually incomplete, and set apart factual beliefs and representational beliefs, i.e., beliefs with semipropositional representations as their objects. In the case of the former, there is awareness “just of a set of ’facts’“ (p. 80); in the case of the latter, there is “awareness of a commitment to a representation,” and a belief that a representation is “quasi true only” (p. 67). Objects of factual beliefs are not simply observational statements of the old empiricist tradition, but propositions about data in Bogen and Woodward’s sense. Objects of representational beliefs are partially true statements about models of data, instrumentation, and experiments, as well as about phenomenological and theoretical models. And significantly, what is common to representational beliefs is not only commitment to a representation, but also the mediation of their evidence (warrant) “by the beliefs of other epistemic agents,” who have direct evidence (p. 75). I think that Da Costa and French are right when claiming that their idea of “representational belief in a semipropositional representation taken as partially true only … fully captures the vagueness, uncertainty, and fallibility of a scientist’s doxastic attitude” (p. 77). It also enables them to introduce a concept of semipropositional knowledge that accounts for nonlinguistic elements of knowledge “encoded” in models, instruments etc., and to consider the acceptance of inconsistent theories. A belief in an inconsistent theory can be clarified with the help of a paraconsistent doxastic logic. An inconsistent theory, regarded as if it were true, is pragmatically true, heuristically fertile, and typically “points the way to a consistent successor” (p. 94).

Da Costa and French believe that their conceptual weaponry enables them “to construct a unitary account of theory ’development’ in which theories and models are proposed, developed, pursued, and justified in a complex web of structural engagements” (p. 107). Identifying the “driving forces behind this development” with “the structural engines of theory development” they separate themselves from the sociology of scientific practice. Had I more space I would cast several doubts on their interpretation of sociology of science. Here I restrict myself to noticing that they maintain the epistemic (objective)-social dichotomy, contrary to their general tendency to overcome dichotomies. According to Da Costa and French, we learn (social) conventions and exemplars, but not epistemic rules, criteria, and guidelines (pp. 125-129). Are we born with them or are they objectively contained in “the field of representations?” And how “objective,” i.e., non-social and agent independent, are representations if “proposed, developed, pursued, and justified” within a socio-historical practice?

Da Costa and French’s discussion of justification raises even more substantial doubts. Beginning in Chap. 7 with a confusing classification of “forms of induction,” they introduce a concept of a (quasi true) pragmatic proposition that ascribes quasi truth to another proposition (in a simple pragmatic structure, in a domain) (p. 135), and proceed toward their own inductive logic, “tentative, local, and instrumental” (p. 138). Constructing this system they not only abandon the initial “holistic” understanding of the bearers of quasi truth, but also fail to realize that such a shift from partial truth of a (complex) conception to partial truth of a single proposition considered within the context of reasoning may require the introduction of new concepts, such as conditional partial truth and tentative partial truth. Second-level qualifications would help the job of grasping the difference between the conditions of ascribing quasi truth to pragmatic propositions, i.e., (metalanguage) propositions asserting that other propositions are partially true, and the conditions of attributing partial truth to the latter propositions (theories), i.e., those that are “connected” to pragmatic structures partially representing the world. In short, I don’t think that a deflationary strategy of equating “a belief that p is true,” in the truth-as-correspondence sense, with “a belief that p” can be applied to partial truth. Even if in both cases, namely, a proposition p and a proposition about the partial truthfulness of p, “the chain of epistemic dependence terminates in a factual belief of some kind” (p. 66), these are very different kinds of factual beliefs. In the first case they refer to “the facts of the world,” in the second case to the states of (present) knowledge and to other epistemic agents, who have direct evidence. In other words, I doubt that the unquestionable contextual nature of quasi truth can be sufficiently clarified by relating it to partial structures modeling fragments of the world; it also needs to be related to (partial) “background” knowledge and acceptance that is limited, conditional, and tentative.

Da Costa and French describe their approach as a middle-way attempt to abandon dichotomies plaguing philosophy of science: theoretical vs. observational, theories vs. models, justification vs. discovery, etc. Even referring to the realism-antirealism debate they feel that their “framework can be pressed into service by either side in this debate” and that both sides can “benefit from the partial structures approach” (pp. 160, 194). They present several arguments used in this debate to justify both sides, and shape realism and empiricism into their structural versions. As announced, they don’t take any side in this debate, but--in my opinion--the overall slant of the book is realist.

To summarize: da Costa and French intend to overcome the “gulf between our actual knowledge-gathering activities and the philosophical characterization of these activities” (p. 3), and to study actual scientific practice, yet what they really discuss are theories, models, and a scientist’s attitudes toward them, such as acceptance, commitment, and believe. They locate their account as post the naturalist turn and within a rationalist approach, though they shape their concepts from within the analytic (logical in the model-theoretic sense) and empirical tradition since they define a partial structure that models a given domain of knowledge beginning with a structure, whose range is a set of observable individuals of this domain, and allow it to be enriched later “by the introduction of further individuals representing so-called unobservable entities” (p. 28). Mobilizing numerous ideas elaborated by others and presenting ongoing debates, they show that there are many fellow travelers heading toward a common goal. Their book seems to me to be a significant step toward a realistic philosophical view concerning research practice, though still a long way remains before the journey is completed.