Science and Religion in Wittgenstein's Fly-Bottle

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Tim Labron, Science and Religion in Wittgenstein's Fly-Bottle, Bloomsbury, 2017, 152pp., $25.99, ISBN 9781501305894.

Reviewed by Yuval Avnur, Scripps College


Tim Labron argues that the much-discussed conflict between science and religion is an illusion created by a confused sort of realism. Wittgenstein and Bohr, with some help from Labron and others, can help us get unconfused. Once we renounce realism, we see that science and religion are two "non-overlapping magisteria" after all, though perhaps not in the sense intended by Steven Jay Gould (who made that phrase famous in his 1999 book, Rock of Ages).

The conflict between science and religion, as "new atheists" such as Richard Dawkins see it, is straightforward: Science and religion both attempt to describe and explain the world, but these explanations and descriptions are incompatible. This is often followed by an argument that science has it right, and religion's claims are laughably inadequate. One familiar way to defend religion here is to reject the idea that religion offers the sort of descriptive claims and explanations that would produce a conflict. For Gould (a scientist), science is about facts, while religion is about values. For Huston Smith (a religious studies scholar) science is about facts, but only facts about part of reality. He argued in his 2001 book, Why Religion Matters that science tells us nothing about whether there are further things (which may be significant to our values) beyond the physical universe. But whether the extra-scientific realm consists in values or other supernatural facts, these versions of the "non-overlapping magisteria" objection to the science-religion conflict assure us that both science and religion can, in their own way, correspond correctly to reality.

Those on both sides of the "science versus religion" debate have objected to such views. From the science side, one suspects that there is nothing to values or apparently extra-physical "things" that is not reducible to the physical. From the religion side, one suspects that making the divine just a value, or just another thing, cheapens or at least misconstrues the meaning of religion. Mark Johnston goes so far as to claim that theologies focused on the supernatural tempt us toward spiritual "idolatry" (in his 2006 book Saving God, ch. 3). In these ways and others, one might be dissatisfied with recent attempts to make nice between science and religion. Enter Wittgenstein, escorted by Labron: there is no independent reality for the two magisteria to correspond with or be in conflict about, really (in a special sense of "really"). Both magisteria belong to our form of life, rather than to an independent nature. What makes Labron's approach unique is that he undermines the standard picture of both religion and science, in order to show that the science-religion conflict isn't just based on a misinterpretation of religion. It's based on a misinterpretation of reality.

Labron's idea is that the objects described by science and appealed to in religious discourse are not "real" in the sense of existing entirely independently of our language, observations, or information about them. His alternative to realism is based on a deep interpretation of Wittgenstein on language (including the language of mathematics), and on the writings of Niels Bohr on quantum phenomena. Those looking for a creative and detailed application of Wittgenstein's views to quantum mechanics and religion, or a detailed account of Wittgenstein's non-realism, will not be disappointed. Those primarily interested in realism as a metaphysical view, at least from an analytic philosophical perspective, should have a look, but expect some frustration. Some formulations of the preferred alternative to realism afford the reader real insights into this tricky topic. But, as I will suggest below, some of the argumentation may disappoint. Still, it is an attempt at reinterpreting science, religion, and much else that is well worth considering.

The book has three main chapters: on Wittgenstein, Science, and Religion. The first sets out the basic elements of Wittgensteinian philosophy of language that will be appealed to throughout the book. At the end of the chapter, we arrive at this take on truth:

As Wittgenstein has shown, true and false are applied within the grammar of language and mathematics; they have no place empirically defining reality itself . . . what makes a physics proposition true is that it meets with observation; however, what it meets with is not simply observation, it is what we observe in the particular experimental arrangements. The language regarding the observation follows a particular grammar and mathematical syntax that are part of our form of life . . . the logic shown in the language of physics is internal to that very language, and this logic is neither true nor false; however, what is said after an experiment is itself true or false based on what is observed and mediated by language. (47)

The form of the observation, which confirms or disconfirms our hypotheses, is determined by language, which is part of our form of life. Truth is, in this sense, "internal" to our form of life. There is nothing "out there" in nature, independent of our grammatical categories, with which our beliefs must or even can correspond if they are to be true. But nor is it the case that we invent the truth with our ideas, since "what is observed" still determines what is true. Here I worry about a possible equivocation: "what is observed" can refer to the observation or to that which was observed/the content of the observation (e.g., my experience of the squirrel is one thing, the squirrel is another). Why think that the latter, which surely determines truth (and is part of nature), is at all "mediated by language?" But the primary task, I assume, is to see what Wittgenstein can do for us here, not to see if Wittgenstein was right. And Labron makes a plausible case for his interpretation of Wittgenstein.

In the next chapter, Labron interprets the essential lesson of quantum mechanics. Just as he sees Wittgenstein as placing truth or reality inside our language games, he sees Bohr as placing the elementary particles, the quantum phenomena, inside our observations, or our collectively intelligible information. This is what Labron calls the 'language matrix': "our understanding of, and participation with, reality. This . . . takes the foundational weight off our minds (subjectivity) and the physical world (objectivity)." (82) The idea is that the role that the physical world plays according to a standard realist view is played instead by our linguistically structured information about it. Humanly conceptualized information (and its form) are the epistemological and metaphysical foundation, or basis, for all reality. That's Labron's alternative to realism, and his argument that this was Bohr's view seems solid. In Bohr's own words: "It is wrong to think that the task of physics is to find out how Nature is. Physics concerns what we can say about Nature." (55) Objectivity, on such a picture of reality is, roughly, a matter of inter-subjective intelligibility (82, 105).

But, the analogy between Bohr's take on quantum theory and Wittgenstein's views remains somewhat obscure throughout, despite numerous intriguing attempts to draw the connection. The closest I came to getting clear was during a discussion of Bohr's apparent insistence that physics be expressed, ultimately, using ordinary terms rather than formal or technical ones. But, even here, I suspect that this is a requirement due to our capacity to understand things, rather than a point about the nature of truth and reality.

Some analytic philosophers may find the methodology frustrating. The argumentation proceeds by organizing an impressive array of quotations into a larger picture. This piecing together of fragments of the literature on quantum physics has its philosophical risks. Which theorists are quoted and which are left out, what support do they have for what they're stating, and how well supported are alternative or opposing conclusions? Thus, we are left with the question: what exactly is the objection to realism? We all know that quantum theory presents us with apparent paradox. But to get from there to a rejection of realism, we need a more direct and substantive argument.

We see a need for more substantive argument when Labron discusses Anton Zeilinger on realism on p. 79-80: "The distinction between reality and our knowledge of reality, between reality and information, cannot be made. There is no way to refer to reality without using the information we have about it." But, the fact that there is no way to refer to X without using Y doesn't entail that there is no real distinction between X and Y. Why couldn't Y simply be the only available means for some creatures to refer to X, while X is construed as a realist wants? And wasn't the distinction between information and reality already made when Zeilinger wrote "information we have about it?" He must have meant information about reality. Labron goes on to quote others (including Wheeler), but the logic of Zeilinger's inference against realism is never addressed or clarified; the inference is displayed, and taken at face value.

Similar issues come up throughout the chapter. For example, while explaining another quote (this time from Ilham Dilman), Labron writes, "there is no language or physical world that people created ex nihilo, these things form us. At the same time, our reality is not a reality that is entirely external to us since it is our language and participation that form our conception of that reality." (82-3) Presumably if we were formed by something, that thing is real (and notice this includes the "physical world"). And presumably, for the realist, our conception of reality is one thing, and our reality is another. So, for the realist, how does it follow, from how our conception of it is formed, that reality isn't "entirely external to us?" So, again, Labron's remarks don't amount to an argument against realism, but rather tend to assume that realism is false. This point is not addressed directly or sufficiently. Hence, the realist will probably remain unconvinced.

However, I do not think that the above critique necessarily undermines the chapter. What Labron does here is something similar to what Wittgenstein (arguably) does: he presents a picture, in the hope that the reader will find it compelling. It makes for fascinating reading, and most readers will learn quite a lot from this chapter, as I did.

In any case, the resulting picture is this: "what is internal to language is reality -- not a particular particle that may or may not exist. Instead, what is internal to language is grammar, the realm within which we can say a particle is here or there once measured." (105)

The third chapter is concerned with religion. Just as the foundation of physical reality is the "language matrix," the foundation or justification of religion is our religious practice itself, complete with its own grammar and logic. Divine reality exists within our practice, which does not imply that it is subjective, constructed, or unreal (see, e.g., p. 99 on the apparent arbitrariness of the form of life giving rise to religious practice). Furthermore, the role of religion need not be construed as describing or explaining some independent reality out there: "believing in God is not a statement of fact, or accepting that a hypothesis is correct; instead, it is a confession and a relationship." (116) The reality in which there is a God, in which religion is "true," arises from our form of life.

According to this view, the claims of religion are entirely compatible with, are not about the same "stuff" as, and need not be grounded on, the claims of science. So, there's no conflict. This provides a direct objection to the Dawkins-style takedown of religion, which is that religion is a wildly inaccurate description or explanation of reality. And this is achieved without entirely deflating or subjectivising religion:

the reality of God is not provided through scientific or physical object investigation; instead it is based on our form of life. Yet, as is the case for language (to abate the realists' alarm here), we do not simply create, willy-nilly, logic, mathematics, and God. The problem does not reside in potential worries regarding relativism and arbitrariness; rather, it resides with the idea that we need to seek foundations to justify logic, mathematics, and God. (106)

We've seen, at this point, that our form of life, via language games, establishes the reality in which a particular, say, particle exists at a certain position. Now, the suggestion is that the reality of God (and presumably other postulates of religion) is also established by our form of life. If we can say that God's existence is as real as a particle or its position, then that's pretty real! How are these different facts related? Labron writes, "Just as the observer and the measurements form meaning regarding the quantum, in a sense the quantum reveals itself in the experiments, so is the case with God and the individual, where this participatory relationship, rather than a theory, shows God." (114) The atheist, it seems, is merely missing out on a form of life.

As I understand it, on this view, the claim that God exists is not an answer to a metaphysical question, because all such questions are misguided. Rather, the existence of God is part of how one lives. That doesn't make it any less objective than the information-dependence of the quantum does. Those who study religion will feel familiar with many claims in this chapter, though the details, brought out by comparison with the Wittgenstein-Bohr interpretation of quantum mechanics, are certainly given a unique "spin." And what one gains by the end of this last chapter is more than just a strategy for religious apology. By the end of the book, one grasps a unique philosophical approach to reality itself. This alone is well worth the trip.