Science and Spirituality: Making Room for Faith in the Age of Science

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Michael Ruse, Science and Spirituality: Making Room for Faith in the Age of Science, Cambridge UP, 2010, 264pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521755948.

Reviewed by Stephen R.L. Clark, University of Liverpool


Michael Ruse is well-known to philosophers, biologists and the wider public as an erudite and civil defender of neo-Darwinian theory against the criticisms of both Biblical fundamentalists and Intelligent Design theorists. In this book he argues that core beliefs of the Western Christian tradition (he nowhere tells us how that tradition differs from non-Western sorts) are at least compatible with current scientific theory, and may be accepted “by faith” while still admiring and endorsing the results of scientific reason as they relate to this-worldly concerns. How we are to respond to those who accept rather different doctrines, also “by faith”, he does not explain: it is apparently enough that we are all at liberty to adopt whatever non-empirical creed most appeals. The whole is cheerfully and clearly written, with occasional barbed comments on the writings of Dawkins, Dennett, Polkinghorne, or Gould. His aim, he tells us, is not to convert, but only to explain.

In the first four chapters Ruse offers a fairly uncontroversial account of the development of naturalistic science, particularly astronomy and biology, from the Greeks to the present day, paying particular attention to the changing metaphors by which investigators organized their material. What hidden assumptions guided their work (as others may guide ours)? Is the world better conceived as an organism or a machine? What are the implications of speaking of living bodies as “machines”: does this imply that they are artefacts, designed for a purpose, or merely that they operate “mechanically” (whatever quite that means)? What role must final causes play in our understanding? They have been largely abandoned in physics, but biologists continue to use them at least heuristically (and now have some idea how the appearance of design could come about). Our moral reasoning, in particular, is not guided by an intuition of transcendental values, but only by the motives and inhibitions to be expected in our sort of social species.

Specialists may quarrel with some of Ruse’s asides. It is far from clear, for example, that Plato believed that there were two worlds, the one we live in and the Real World of Forms: the better account would almost certainly be that the one real world was that discovered by and in the intellect, which our senses and our desires obscure for us. It was also Plato, rather than Adam Smith, who first recognized the significance of “the division of labour”. No-one who thinks that “final causes” are an important element in our understanding of the world supposes that this is a form of backward causation made more problematic by the possible non-existence of the putative goal (it would in fact be better to speak of “teleological explanations”, to avoid confusion). Despite a passing nod to the achievements of Islamic civilization in astronomy and medicine, Ruse’s history is firmly Western and Whiggish. But he avoids many other popular errors (that people thought the world was flat until Columbus proved otherwise and that the Roman Church was systematically opposed to scientific innovation).

The moral of his brief history, culminating in the modern study of the mind as a product of brain chemistry, is the triumph of the machine metaphor (and now especially the computer metaphor) and the conclusion that “free will” in anything but the Hobbesian sense is probably an illusion. In the following chapters Ruse identifies certain problems that, perhaps, current scientific theory either has not solved or cannot. Why is there anything at all? What authority have our mathematical or moral intuitions, and what is the ontological status of mathematical objects and moral values? How can consciousness be explained or understood as an outcome of strictly material processes? Is there a point to existence? Not everyone thinks these questions meaningful. Not everyone thinks that science can’t answer them. But Ruse makes a good case for supposing that the questions do matter to many of us, and that no merely empirical enquiry can deal with them. Nor would matters be made easier, he suggests, by attempting to revive the organicist metaphor as a way of analysing biological reality.

As in the earlier chapters, there are some minor solecisms: James Lovelock, for example, does not suppose that human beings are the pinnacle of a chain of being (but, at best, have some chance of speaking as “shop stewards” for other living things), and George Berkeley was not a Bishop until late in life. It is difficult not to suspect that Ruse’s faintly amused tolerance for the (mostly German or Germanophile) thinkers who have emphasised the importance of the whole organism or whole system in understanding what happens makes it hard for him to take the arguments here seriously. In another context he might well have noticed how un-mechanical (by any earlier understanding of machinery) modern physical theories are, how much more like the older Stoic models than the Epicurean, and how un-mechanical modern machines are. In another context he might have paid more attention, here as in other chapters, to the historical background of these speculations in late Hellenistic, Patristic and Islamic thought.

Having provided a summary (and not wholly misleading) account of the history and current conclusions of the Western scientific enterprise, Ruse sketches what he takes to be the core doctrines of Western Christianity, both Catholic and Protestant. There is a God, creator of heaven and earth. We humans have duties, and God will judge us for our efforts to fulfil them. Christ came to earth to help us, “because we are worth the effort by God”. And finally, there is the promise of life everlasting. This is, admittedly, to “brush past” a great deal of Christian theology and practice: the Trinity, church fellowship, great art and political inspiration — and especially the Incarnation. It may also seem to many Christians to offer subtle or not so subtle distortions of what they believe.

Ruse gives a sketchy account of some of the arguments for and against the existence and creative activity of a necessary, divine being, the force of a morality that goes beyond the rules required in a social, bisexual species, the supposed “problem of evil”, the possibility of miracles and of the resurrection of our living bodies into a world beyond the reach of empirical science. Reading a little between the lines, it seems likely that part of his solution to the problem of evil (in the specific form of the problem of pre-human physical suffering) is that pre-humans aren’t properly conscious, and their putative sufferings are amply justified by the eventual appearance of human consciousness (unplanned in detail, however likely in general). It seems likely that he also prefers most or all of the Gospel miracles to be naturally explained (people were shamed into sharing their private picnic baskets, rather than that Jesus multiplied the loaves and fishes, and Jesus’s disciples were weirdly encouraged and enlivened by his execution rather than that he really rose from the dead), though he acknowledges that many Christians take a stronger line. He also acknowledges that some Christians (and other believers) think “natural theology” (that is, the use of reason to uncover divine truths) is possible and even obligatory, but himself prefers to present Christian beliefs as based entirely “on faith”, with only the proviso that they do not contradict the results of “science” (that is, the use of reason to uncover truths about this world here).

The point of Ruse’s volume is presumably to persuade believers that they need not be opposed to the scientific enterprise and unbelievers that they need not be so vitriolic in their condemnation of “religion”. On the one hand, Christians don’t need to reject the neo-Darwinian theory of evolution, and on the other they shouldn’t depend on hints from physicists that the universe seems oddly fine-tuned for the emergence of life and consciousness, still less on any hints that more is going on in evolutionary history than random mutation and natural selection. Faith, as “the substance of things hoped for, the evidence of things not seen” (Hebrews 11:1), is enough — perhaps together with participation in the life of whatever particular church proves most acceptable.

My own suspicion is that it is not so easy to divide the spheres of faith and reason. It takes considerable faith, for example, to believe that the very same laws of nature apply throughout reality and that those laws are remotely accessible to the human mind (a problem Ruse insists that “the Victorians” would not have noticed — forgetting that Charles Darwin did, as Alvin Plantinga has pointed out). It also takes faith, and considerable devotion, to believe that reality is worth knowing, and that it’s therefore worth struggling to discover a coherent, unified theory of everything (which we certainly don’t have now). Without those dogmas, “science” only names a compendium of sometimes useful techniques and partial hypotheses which we have no reason to expect to be coherent or of any more general interest than stamp collecting. The question must then be: what sort of universe must we think this is if those dogmas are to be believable? And the answer, perhaps, is that Christian theism provides a more plausible metaphysics than currently fashionable materialism. Science and Religion, by Ruse’s account, are not at war, only because they have different fields and methods. But perhaps they are not at war because Science depends upon Religion, and rebellion will lead in the end to its disintegration.