Science and the Life-World: Essays on Husserl's 'Crisis of European Sciences'

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David Hyder and Hans-Jörg Rheinberger (eds.), Science and the Life-World: Essays on Husserl's 'Crisis of European Sciences', Stanford UP, 2010, 245 pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780804756044.

Reviewed by Ronald McIntyre, California State University, Northridge



This collection of essays addresses themes in Husserl’s last work, the unfinished Crisis of the European Sciences, written in the years 1934-37. (The Crisis as we now have it, including several important appendices, was not published until 1954, although the first two parts were published in 1936 and the influential appendix called “The Origin of Geometry” in 1939.)

In relation to Husserl’s earlier work the Crisis includes a number of new themes, or themes newly emphasized and developed, that are important not only to phenomenologists but also to philosophers and historians of science. Perhaps the central notion in the Crisis — and certainly the most famous — is what Husserl calls the "Lebenswelt," the “life-world.” The life-world is key to Husserl’s account of what he sees as “the crisis” of the European sciences and its diagnosis. This account leads Husserl to articulate a conception of “Europe” defined by the ideal of rationality and the universality of knowledge, and of the history of European science and mathematics since the time of the ancient Greeks as a pursuit guided by this ideal. The pursuit would seem to have reached its goal with the advent of what Husserl calls “Galilean science,” in which nature is described in terms of purely objective, mathematical laws. But Husserl sees this victory as Pyrrhic, for reasons I will discuss shortly. The Crisis also introduces a new emphasis on “historicity”: Husserl explicitly recognizes science as an historical cultural product, and his analysis of its current state leads him to an unusual kind of search for the life-world “origins” of formal geometry and mathematical natural science — a search that is partly “historical” and partly “ahistorical” or conceptual.

These are the main themes addressed in the twelve essays the volume comprises. David Hyder’s “Introduction,” which gives a helpful overview of each of the essays and their relations to one another, groups the essays under three main headings: Husserl’s theory of science and the notion of the life-world (essays by David Woodruff Smith, Dagfinn Føllesdal, Ulrich Majer, and Ian Hacking), the theory of history implicit in the Crisis (David Carr, Michael Friedman, Rodolphe Gasché, Eva-Marie Engelen, and Michael Hampe), and the dissemination and application of Husserl’s theory of science in the Crisis (Hans-Jörg Rheinberger, David Hyder, and Friedrich Steinle). However, as is characteristic of Husserl’s work, all of the themes of the Crisis are interrelated, and each of the essays overflows whatever area one might assign it to. I will discuss them in relation to the themes I noted above.

The first two essays, Smith’s and Føllesdal’s, situate the Crisis within Husserl’s phenomenology generally. Smith gives an account of Husserl’s conception of theory, and Føllesdal provides a brief overview of some of Husserl’s key concepts: intentionality, the “noema,” evidence, constitution, horizon, intersubjectivity, and the life-world. Both see the Crisis as a development of, but not a substantive break from, Husserl’s earlier views. Føllesdal, Smith, and Friedman see the life-world as essentially what Husserl in Ideas, I (1913) characterized as the world of the “natural attitude.” I think the assimilation of these two notions is helpful in understanding not only the life-world in the Crisis but also the world of the natural attitude in Ideas, I. Among the other essayists, Engelen is the only explicit dissenter, asserting that the “concept of a life-world differs from his [Husserl’s] other works in that it is the natural world” (p. 142). But she doesn’t explain how she would distinguish the “natural world” from the “world of the natural attitude.”

There is a notable difference between the Crisis and the earlier works, though, as Engelen and Friedman point out. In Ideas, I, for example, Husserl proposes to “epoché” the life-world (i.e., to abstain from the ontological commitments of the natural attitude) in order to inaugurate the “transcendental” attitude and launch the discipline of transcendental phenomenology. In the Crisis, he proposes to epoché the world of mathematical science (abstaining from its theoretical commitments) in order to examine the life-world itself, with the immediate goal of understanding the relations between the two. Friedman, though, sees that Husserl’s larger goal remains the same: to establish transcendental phenomenology by examining the life-world itself from the transcendental standpoint. This new way of reaching transcendental phenomenology, Friedman notes, differs from Husserl’s earlier “Cartesian” approach — at least in emphasis — in being non-foundationally motivated, and the transcendental standpoint achieved in the Crisis is explicitly both intersubjective and historically situated.

Two features are definitive of the life-world as Husserl himself characterizes it: it is “pre-given” and “pre-theoretical.” In the Crisis Husserl emphasizes the fact that we can engage the world from many different standpoints or “attitudes”: the theoretical, “naturalistic,” standpoint of natural science — not to be confused with the “natural” attitude of Ideas, I — is but one. (Others include the arithmetical standpoint, characterized in Ideas, I, and the “personalistic” attitude, characterized in Ideas, II. On the later, see Carr, p. 90.) Husserl’s most important point here, which I think is not explicitly made in the present collection, is that the standpoint or attitude that gives us the life-world (whether the same as the natural attitude of Ideas, I or not) is not just another one of the various possible standpoints on the world. Husserl’s view is that the world must first be given to us, experienced by us, in some “natural,” pre-theoretical, way and that only on the basis of that pre-given world can we adopt more specific standpoints from which we may examine the world. (See Crisis, §34e.)

Majer and Føllesdal do emphasize the pre-givenness of the life-world as the background, usually unarticulated and unthematized, against which all our human activities are carried out and without which they would be impossible. Majer, relating Husserl’s ideas to those of David Hilbert and Hermann Weyl, emphasizes that even the activities involved in doing science presuppose an “irreducible fundament” (Weyl’s term) of ordinary, pre-theoretical, abilities. He quotes Weyl: “In physics, when we perform measurements and their necessary operations, we manipulate boards, wires, screws, cog-wheels, point and scale. We move here on the same level of understanding and action as the cabinet-maker or the mechanic in his workshop.” (Quoted by Majer, p. 58.) "’Lebenswelt‘," says Majer, "means a mode of life in which no theoretical knowledge is required, but only some practical abilities of understanding and acting are supposed, like those of the craftsman" (p. 58). These practical abilities — e.g., to use chalk to write symbols on a blackboard, to use a scale for measuring — are enablers of science as a cultural product, and it is the practical rather than the theoretical characteristics of chalk and scale, e.g., that explains their role here. Føllesdal and Friedman note, too, that it is the life-world that provides the ultimate justification for the claims of science: these claims rise or fall on how well predictions match up with life-world experience.

Science is also connected to the life-world historically. In the Crisis Husserl offers his account of this history, which culminates in what he calls Galileo’s “mathematization” of nature. The “origin” of mathematics itself (especially geometry), and of the modern “European” rationalist ideal of universal truth, is in ancient Greece. Friedman and, especially, Gasché provide a detailed and insightful account of Husserl’s views here; I’ll only summarize. Geometry arose in ancient Greece from such life-world activities as measuring and surveying and the recognition that straight lines, circles, etc. can be approximated with ever greater precision. The “abstraction” that produced formal geometry was a great cognitive achievement of human consciousness: the postulation of a set of “ideal” objects (ideal shapes) that can be described by universal laws. These ideal shapes are distinct from the material shapes that one encounters in experience and that one measures, and the truths about them are independent of particular human situations and concerns. Formal geometry, in this sense, epitomizes what Husserl takes to be the European ideal of rationality.

Gasché describes, in considerable detail, how Galilean science took lessons from this success. One lesson, which he sees Husserl as under-recognizing, is that universality became intimately associated with spatiality and hence with res extensa. What Husserl clearly does see in Galileo is an attempt to extend the idealization of shape to other properties that, like shape, are subject to successively more precise measurement or quantification, so that (the idealized versions of) these properties can also be described in universal, mathematical, laws. Of course, not everything is quantifiable; in particular, sensible qualities as experienced are not. So, Galilean science now ascribes to them the inferior status of “secondary” qualities, mere appearances; and it attempts to “indirectly” mathematize them by postulating regular causal connections between them and the ultimately “real” primary qualities. With all of nature thus idealized and mathematized, our understanding of nature finally meets the rational ideal of universality.

Husserl finds many problems with this result. Foremost is that the world described by science is not the life-world of immediate experience but an inexperienceable “in-itself.” Says Husserl:

The contrast between the subjectivity of the life-world and the “objective,” the “true” world, lies in the fact that the latter is a theoretical-logical substruction … of something that is in principle not perceivable, in principle not experienceable in its own proper being, whereas the subjective, in the life-world, is distinguished in all respects precisely by its being actually experienceable. (Crisis, §34d.)

Nonetheless, after Galileo, this extra-experiential theoretical construct comes to be equated with reality itself, thus relegating the life-world of experience to a secondary or illusory status:

But now we must note something of the highest importance that occurred even as early as Galileo: the surreptitious substitution of the mathematically substructed world of idealities for the only real world, the one that is actually given through perception, that is ever experienced and experienceable - our everyday life-world. This substitution was promptly passed on to his successors, the physicists of all the succeeding centuries. (Crisis, §9h.)

If the intuited world of our life is merely subjective, then all the truths of pre and extrascientific life which have to do with its factual being are deprived of value. They have meaning only insofar as they, while themselves false, vaguely indicate an in-itself which lies behind this world of possible experience and is transcendent in respect to it. (Crisis, §9i.)

Husserl thus sees contemporary science as having lost sight of its origins in the life-world, of its original usefulness in the solution of practical problems arising in the life-world, of its dependence on the life-world both for its own practices and for the verification of its results, and even of the goal of providing a theory of reality as we experience it. Accordingly, science has lost its relevance to and meaning for humanity.

That, then, is the main thrust of Husserl’s narrative. But the narrative is not without its problems, and I’ll briefly mention some of them that the essays in this volume bring to light.

1. Husserl’s analysis of how science and mathematics can lose their way invokes a notion that he calls “sedimentation”: during the course of history, earlier theories and concepts become buried under later ones, so that their initial motivations and the relations of later developments to earlier become hidden and forgotten. Husserl proposes that this process can be halted and its deleterious effects remedied by uncovering the buried origins. (Hyder characterizes this as a kind of phenomenological archeology, which he compares and contrasts with Foucault’s attempt to uncover “historical a prioris.”) Hacking, though, objects to this project. He is suspicious of those who “lust for things primal” and who believe that discovering the “origin” of a problem is key to its solution, noting (in what I consider an unfair association) Freud’s discredited appeal to the “primal scene” in his analysis of the “Wolfman.” More seriously, Hacking challenges the claim that mathematics and science are as sedimented as Husserl believes. He claims that practicing mathematicians present their results in terms that laymen familiar with basic mathematics can understand and which, therefore, are not “sedimented” beneath layers of higher and higher mathematical theory.

But even if Hacking is right about that, sedimentation, to serve Husserl’s purposes, need not be construed so narrowly. Steinle, in a most interesting account of the work of Charles Dufay on electricity in the early 18th century, offers a convincing example. Prior to Dufay, no one had conceived of the bi-polarity of electricity and many puzzling effects had been observed. After much effort and experimentation, which Steinle describes, Dufay proposed in 1734 a new concept (but not a new theory) of electricity: electricity comes in two forms, positive and negative. According to Steinle, this conceptual distinction was so successful in explaining the previously puzzling effects of electricity that within slightly more than a decade the bi-polarity of electricity was simply accepted among scientists and quickly taken as a given by craftsmen in their choice of materials and design of machines and instruments. Sedimentation, in the sense suggested by Steinle, means nothing more than the uncritical acceptance of a concept or theory that has become so normal or ordinary that no one thinks to question it. And, according to Husserl, that’s exactly how formal geometry appeared to Galileo.

2. Husserl characterizes the life-world as “pre-theoretical.” Is “pre-” meant here in an historical or an ahistorical sense? This is an important question, discussed by several of the essayists, including Carr, Friedman, Hacking, Hyder, Engelen, and Hampe. In his earlier writings, Husserl is usually in search of conceptual priorities: for example, the experience of physical objects is “prior” to the experience of persons, not because there was a time in which we experienced mere physical objects and a later time in which we experienced persons, but because the experience of physical objects is conceptually more basic — the concept “person” includes the concept “physical object,” but not vice versa. But the relation of science to the life-world is more complicated: here there is not only a conceptual but an historical relationship as well: science is conceptually dependent on the life-world, in ways we’ve already discussed; but there was also an actual time in history prior to the advent of theoretical thinking (or so Husserl believes). One can make Husserl’s search for “origins” appear trivial or misguided by overemphasizing the historical aspect (as I think Hacking and Engelen sometimes tend to do). But I agree with Hampe and Carr (and most of the other essayists) that Husserl is not offering a history in the ordinary sense.

3. Engelen raises the question of whether there can be such a thing as a “pre-theoretical” life-world. She asks, specifically, why the “art” of surveying, which Husserl locates within the life-world of the ancient Greeks, should not be considered an applied science. The answer I’d give, on behalf of Husserl, is that “applied” science presupposes “science” itself, which — given the hypothetical scenario — does not yet exist. Still, her question raises the more general one of how useful the distinction between the pre-theoretical and the theoretical can be in characterizing the life-world. Husserl’s preferred distinction seems to be that what is immediately experienceable is pre-theoretical, while appeals to extra-experiential entities to explain what is immediately experienceable are theoretical. Given this, how should we classify Greek mythology vis-à-vis the life-world of ancient Greece? Do the Gods belong to the life-world of the ancient Greeks, or are they theoretical posits designed to explain events in the life-world?

Many of the essayists make illuminating, and sometimes surprising, connections between Husserl’s ideas and those of others, including Carnap and Quine (Smith), Sellars (Hampe), Hilbert and Weyl (Majer), Fleck and Bachelard (Rheinberger), and Foucault and Cavaillès (Hyder). The volume thus has the virtue of presenting Husserl and the Crisis as very much alive and still in the game.