Science before Socrates: Parmenides, Anaxagoras, and the New Astronomy

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Daniel W. Graham, Science before Socrates: Parmenides, Anaxagoras, and the New Astronomy, Oxford University Press, 2013, 287pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199959785.

Reviewed by Jenny Bryan, University College London


There seems to be something of a trend in current scholarship on the Presocratics, and on Parmenides in particular, to focus on the apparent value of their natural philosophy. In most cases, this translates into efforts to identify evidence of advances in scientific knowledge based on correct (or, at least, plausible) interpretation of empirical evidence. There is a commonly held desire to emphasise that (some of) the Presocratics were engaged in more than armchair speculation about first principles or the physical nature of the heavenly bodies. Rather, it is argued, these thinkers should be acknowledged not only as getting things right about, in particular, astronomy, but as having got them right on the basis of what we might think is acceptable scientific practice, i.e., by thinking carefully and systematically about the available data. Daniel Graham’s very interesting, learned and enjoyable book makes an explicit and detailed case for the need to acknowledge the scientific methods, progress and success of Parmenides and Anaxagoras in particular. His focus is on the scientific contributions of these figures to astronomy in general and the understanding of eclipses in particular, and his narrative is one of a shift away from the unfounded speculation of Milesian philosophy towards genuine empirical science: a ‘New Astronomy’.

Some may wonder if it really matters who first worked out the source of the moon’s illumination and its causal connection to the phenomenon of the eclipse. Graham clearly thinks it obvious that it does matter that, as he argues, these discoveries belong in large part to Parmenides and Anaxagoras. He presents himself as correcting the misconception that Presocratic science is unempirical and thus unscientific. For Graham, it is a matter of giving these thinkers the credit they deserve for the discoveries they made and for the way that they made them. They were real and successful scientists and should be acknowledged as such. In fact, his account will be of value even to those who don’t find themselves quite so vexed by the need to attribute achievements for the sake of the record. Anyone, for example, interested in Parmenides’ ontology or epistemology must be interested in his attitude towards sense perception and its objects. If Graham is right that Parmenides must be credited with genuine advances in empirical science, we are surely forced to reconsider how such activities can be reconciled with his apparent disdain for sense perception and denial of the possibility of change. Admittedly, Graham does not pursue this particular issue in any great detail, except to note that his account of these figures as successful scientists may conflict with standard assessments of them as philosophers (39-40), but he produces an account that will provide a new, perhaps more focussed, means of approaching the questions of the coherence of Parmenides’ philosophy and of his influence on later Presocratics.

Graham’s aim is to correct the standard claim that genuinely scientific astronomy began in the mid-fourth century BCE, prior to which natural philosophers were limited to speculative cosmology. In Chapter 1 (‘Looking for Science’), he offers a valuable consideration of where his account sits amongst a plurality of contemporary attitudes towards the possibility of historical and scientific truth, as well as the variety of accounts of the beginnings of Greek science (as originating with Thales or Pythagoras, for example). In the end, he admits that he will be offering an ‘unapologetically “continuist” and “progressivist”’ (38) account of what he takes to be the objective historical facts of the discovery of objective scientific truths. Indeed, he suggests that his narrative provides a compelling counterexample to denials of scientific progress and fact. This is because it describes a clear case of the development of superior understanding of astronomical phenomena, proven by an improved ability to make accurate predictions. Bearing in mind that a large part of what follows is based on Graham’s interpretation of potentially ambiguous evidence, the reader may feel the lack of a discussion of Graham’s methodology in approaching the evidence in the discussion that follows. Some consideration of these issues is embedded in the discussion as it progresses, but on occasion we face assessments of evidence as being more or less trustworthy without it being made explicit why we should think it to be so.

Chapter 2 (‘Azure Pastures’) begins at the ‘beginnings of speculation’ (41), taking the ‘mythical cosmography’ of Hesiod’s Theogony as a ‘point of departure’ against which we can compare and contrast the ‘philosophical cosmologies’ that follow. Graham offers a summary of the evidence for the cosmological speculations of the Ionian philosophers from Thales through to Heraclitus. He characterises them as improvements on the myths of Hesiod whilst also seeking to minimize their relevance to genuine science. In surveying the doxographical tradition on Thales, for example, Graham argues that whilst there is good reason to award him the status of founder of the study of astronomy, there is also good reason to doubt most of the claims that are made by later authors about his specific scientific achievements, in particular the claim that he predicted a solar eclipse. Graham goes on to offer a detailed survey of Ionian cosmology in general, concluding that, for all its diversity, it can be classified as adhering to a ‘Meteorological Model’ (84) of explanation whereby no strong distinction is drawn between astronomical and meteorological phenomena. Rather, although explanations of the heavens were offered in purely naturalistic terms (and should thus, I take it, be considered superior to the Hesiodic model), they tended to explain the superlunary constants in terms of the vagaries of sublunary phenomena.

Having demonstrated that the qualified progress of the Ionians does not amount to astronomical science as such, Graham makes his case for attributing the real discoveries to Parmenides in Chapter 3 (‘Borrowed Light’). Key to Graham’s account is his interpretation of Parmenides’ two fragments apparently on the sun and moon, B14 and B15. Graham argues that taken together they represent not just the observation that the moon takes it light from the sun, but also an account of the empirical evidence on which that observation is based. At this point, readers may feel that Graham is rather hasty in claiming that the text supports his interpretation. Of course, there is a doxographical tradition of attributing the discovery of the source of the moon’s illumination (along with other astronomical discoveries) to Parmenides, but to read the incomplete B15 (Graham’s translation is ‘ever gazing toward the rays of the sun’ (91)) as if it is a straightforward claim that the ‘the moon’s shining face is always turned towards the sun’ (91) is to take much for granted. It is certainly a possible and even plausible interpretation of the thought that lies behind what the fragment says, but Graham proceeds as if this is precisely what it says, albeit in ‘poetic terms’ (91). Bearing in mind the brilliance of the discovery that he wants to attribute to Parmenides on the strength of the text, a more thorough argument for the need to read it in this way would have been welcome. Graham goes on to offer some intriguing speculations about how Parmenides may have achieved and ratified his discovery of heliophotism before presenting a welcome, albeit brief, consideration of the possible connection between his astronomy and ontology.

In Chapter 4 (‘Empire of the Sun’), Graham maps out the theoretical implications of the realisation that the moon derives its light from the sun, including that the moon must be opaque and spherical. He argues not only that Anaxagoras was committed to this idea, but also that he grasped and was committed to these significant implications. On Graham’s account, Anaxagoras recognised the truth of Parmenides’ discovery and incorporated it along with its implications for the nature of the heavenly bodies into his ‘New Astronomy’. This more accurate and scientific account rejected the ‘Meteorological Model’ of astronomy in favour of a new ‘Lithic Model’ in which the heavenly bodies are rocky masses different in nature from meteorological phenomena, on the grounds that it was more consistent with his acceptance of heliophotism. The argument for Anaxagoras’ leading role in the development of this new understanding continues in Chapter 5 (‘Darkened Suns and Falling Stars’), which argues both for Anaxagoras’ precedence over Empedocles and for the significance of empirical evidence in the formation and ratification of his theory.

Chapter 6 (‘Lunar Revolutions’) traces the influence of Anaxagoras’ New Astronomy, arguing that its acceptance by later thinkers is, in itself, good evidence that it was presented and received as founded on empirical evidence. Graham surveys astronomical theories in the wake of Anaxagoras (including Plato and Aristotle) to demonstrate his widespread influence. He argues that insofar as the doxographical evidence suggests that ‘after [Anaxagoras] put forth his hypotheses, debate on the topic virtually ceased’, we can assume the presence of a general consensus in favour of this theory.

In his final chapter (‘The Geometry of the Heavens’), Graham provides a useful summary of his narrative before reinforcing his claims about the critical achievements of Parmenides and Anaxagoras as genuine, scientific astronomy. He seeks to defend this claim against a possible objection that their status as scientific is undermined by a lack of mathematical modelling. Finally, he concludes with a return to the question of the reality of scientific progress, arguing that the demonstrable truth of Anaxagoras’ theories provides an undeniable connection to modern science and a clear blow against those who seek to challenge the objectivity of science. Two useful appendices are included, providing, respectively, an account of Anaxagoras’ standard role in the historiography of science and further discussion of the objectivity or otherwise of science and history.

Graham has produced a fascinating and enjoyable challenge to the standard narrative of scientific progress. The passion of his commitment to rehabilitating Parmenides and Anaxagoras as successful scientists is clear throughout. I am doubtful that those who are more sceptical about the objectivity of science or possibility of truth in history will find themselves converted by this test-case, and I suspect that some may find room to resist his account where it is itself most speculative, but there’s no doubt that it provides an useful new focus to the debate.