Science, Culture, and Free Spirits: A study of Nietzsche's Human, All-too-Human

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Jonathan R. Cohen, Science, Culture, and Free Spirits: A study of Nietzsche's Human, All-too-Human, Humanity Books, 2010, 305pp., $36.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781591026808.

Reviewed by Julian Young, Wake Forest University



Jonathan Cohen’s thoughtful interrogation of Human, All-too-Human asks many of the right questions.1 Often (though perhaps not always) it gets the answers importantly right. As Cohen remarks, there are relatively few studies of individual Nietzsche texts, and Human, marking as it does the transition from the early, metaphysical romanticism to the naturalism that characterised the remainder of his career, is surely a crucial work. Cohen’s study does not, however, attempt to be comprehensive. There is no discussion of Human‘s praise for the ’noble’ religion of the Greeks, its account of the role of art in a reformed culture, its advocacy of euthanasia and eugenics, its critique of the modern state,2 its advocacy of the disappearance of petty nationalisms in a united Europe, nor of its ambition that a reformed Western culture should take over the entire globe. Nor does Cohen discuss either Assorted Opinions and Maxims or The Wanderer and His Shadow which together, in 1886, became volume II of an expanded Human, All-too-Human. Instead, he discusses, as his title promises, the interrelated themes of science, culture and free-spiritedness as they appear in the original 1878 work. Human, All-too-Human: Central Themes might be an alternative title. In addition to examining these — indeed central — themes there is a discussion of the ‘literary integrity’ of the work (chapter 6). Here, Cohen is at pains to show that the work is no mere rag-bag of ‘aphorisms’ but has a literary, even logical, structure. He makes the original and plausible suggestion that the model for the 1886 expansion of Human into a two-volume work was Schopenhauer’s 1844 addition of a volume II to the 1818 The World as Will and Representation. A final chapter argues, correctly in my view, that the basic relationship between science, culture and free-spiritedness established in Human remains with Nietzsche for the rest of his career.

Chapter 1 deals with the views on science and culture presented in the texts of the early period, The Birth of Tragedy and the four Untimely Meditations. As Cohen observes, these texts are anti-science. In The Birth science (‘Socratism’) is held to be that which destroyed the ‘Dionysian’ metaphysics on which Greek cheerfulness depended, while in the Untimely Meditations science as ‘objective, impartial, and unselective’ (p. 65), as a mere ‘encyclopaedia of facts’ (p. 68), threatens the unity on which culture depends — culture being defined by Nietzsche as a ‘unity of artistic style in all the expressions of the life of a people’. Cohen detects an inherent ‘instability’ in this early conception of culture: on the one hand it is supposed to ‘cultivate’ individuality which would require it to be ‘variegated’, but on the other it’s supposed to be unified. (pp. 41-4).

This is, I think, the least satisfactory chapter. It suffers from trying, in a mere twenty pages, to provide a homogeneous account of five highly individual texts and from not inquiring more closely into what Nietzsche means by ‘science’ (Wissenschaft). What actually connects ‘science’ to the idea of an ‘encyclopaedia of facts’ is that, most of the time, what he has in mind is not natural science but rather — particularly historical — scholarship. Yet it is not, in fact, scholarship itself Nietzsche regards as a threat to culture. Rather it is the unparalleled access nineteenth-century scholarship has provided to past and foreign cultures (BT 23) that has turned, not science, but rather modern man, into a mere ‘walking encyclopaedia’ (UM II 4) and ‘fairground motley’ (UM I 1). Nietzsche’s objection to modernity’s information overload is that it undermines both our meaning-giving faith in our own culture and our creativity: creativity succumbs to the sense that ’it’s all been done before’ so that all that is left is a (postmodern) combination of bits and pieces of past and alien cultures.

A second difficulty in this opening chapter is the idea that culture cannot be unified and yet at the same time promote individuality. It seems to me that a central theme that runs through all Nietzsche’s works early and late is precisely the denial of this. As he says in Beyond Good and Evil, human ‘greatness’ consists in ‘the very scope and variety of humanity, in unity in multiplicity’ (BGE 212). This mistake, the confusion of unity with homogeneity, is quite serious because it runs through the whole book. According to Cohen, from Human onwards, Nietzsche wants his readers to learn to be happy in the ‘atomism’ that is modern culture (pp. 186-7). In fact, however, ‘atomized culture’ is for Nietzsche always an oxymoron. As early Nietzsche scorns the ‘fairground motley’ of modernity, so does Zarathustra: he scorns the town called ‘Motley Cow’ not just because of its herd-like character but also because it is ‘motley’. He — Nietzsche - scorns modernity because it is ‘chaos’, a ‘half-barbarism’ -‘half’ because though we have no unified Kultur we do have Civilization (plumbing and the police) (BGE 223-4). Even in Human itself it is clear that where there is ‘culture’ there is unity: ‘The greatest fact in the cultivation of Greece remains that Homer became pan-Hellenic so early … for Homer, by centralising, made everything level, and dissolved the more serious instincts for independence’ (HH 262). According to Human‘s volume II the artist of a reformed culture must recreate such unity: he must

emulate the artists of earlier [Greek] times who imaginatively developed the existing images of the gods and imaginatively develop a beautiful image of man; he will scent out those cases in which … the great and beautiful soul is still possible, still able to embody itself in the harmonious and well-proportioned, thus acquiring visibility, duration and the status of a model (AOM 99).

Chapter 2 asks why the turn from the science-hatred of the early works to the science-enthusiasm of Human happened. Cohen rejects the influence of Paul Rée as a sufficient cause and points out that there were no scientific advances between 1874 and 1878 of such a magnitude as to make the power — and hence claim to truth — of modern science unmistakable. (There were, however, tremendous technological advances between 1840 and 1878 — railways, the telegraph and the telephone — which may have had a delayed impact on Nietzsche’s view of science.) Cohen eventually finds the ‘trigger’ for Nietzsche’s changed outlook in the first Bayreuth Festival of 1876. The over-heated emotionalism of the Wagnerians needed calming down by the application of cool scientific method. And the dispassionate assembly of little, metaphysics-puncturing facts that Human engages in is ideally suited to the task.

The contrast, here between hot and cold is insightful. Nietzsche’s erstwhile best friend, Erwin Rohde, complained that Human transported him from the ‘hot bath’ of Nietzsche’s romantic-Wagnerian period into an ‘ice-room’.3 Nonetheless, even given Nietzsche’s undoubted obsession with Wagner, the idea that the aim of his turn to science is simply to deal with a couple of thousand Wagnerians surely makes his target too small. For what he is clearly entertaining is the idea that a whole-hearted embrace of science and the scientific spirit will benefit Western culture as a whole. In this regard it is important, I think, to observe that his and Wagner’s romanticism was always a neo-romanticism, that the romantic movement proper was long past and that among educated people in the post-Darwinian world ‘positivism’ was the order of the day. What Nietzsche is doing in Human, I believe, is finally embracing the spirit of his age and — in the experimental way that characterises all his mature thought — seeing how well one can live with, and within, it.

Chapter 3 observes correctly that the attack on metaphysics in Part I of Human is a matter of many local skirmishes (‘skirmishes of an untimely man’) rather than the production of one, all-obliterating killer argument. Cohen provides an interesting take on the difficult question of just what the overall method is that Nietzsche deploys. He sees it as made up of two components. The first consists in offering alternative naturalistic explanations of phenomena which the likes of Kant and Schopenhauer appeal to metaphysics to explain. For example, seemingly altruistic actions which for them demand a self that transcends the deterministic world of nature are explained as simply one drive overcoming another (as a businessman’s concern for his reputation might overcome his desire for a quick profit). By themselves, Cohen suggests, ‘alternative explanation arguments’ only result in a ‘draw’ between two equally comprehensive explanatory systems. However, the second string to Nietzsche’s bow, his ‘origin of belief’ arguments, provides us with a criterion for preferring the naturalistic to the metaphysical explanations. The systematic demonstration that the causes of metaphysical beliefs are anything but reasons for those beliefs — what causes us to believe that ‘deep’ music gives us information about another world is the long association of such music with metaphysical linguistic images — provides the missing criterion.

Most scholars, I think, would be inclined to the view that Human‘s ’historical method’ consists in ‘origin of belief’ arguments alone. And it is hard to assess Cohen’s claim that such arguments work in tandem with ‘alternative explanation’ arguments, since he provides only the one example of such an explanation mentioned above. Cohen’s worry is that while Nietzsche claims to have ‘refuted’ metaphysics, to make that claim on the basis of ‘origin of belief’ arguments alone is to commit the ‘genetic fallacy’ (p. 90), since no matter how bad its causes are a belief may still be true. But since in the same section in which Nietzsche claims his method ‘refutes’ metaphysics he also admits that when all is said and done ‘it is [still] true there could be a metaphysical world’ (HH 9), it seems clear that ‘refutation’ consists in something short of demonstrating falsehood.4

Chapter 4 introduces those ‘for’ whom, according to its subtitle, Human is written, the ‘free spirits’. Free spirits alone - Cohen rightly emphasises that Nietzsche’s aphoristic, or better ‘terse’, style of writing is designed to deter the lazy and therefore inappropriate reader. The first question discussed is: does the intended readership already exist or does the work have to create its audience by psychoanalysing potential free spirits into realising their potential? Cohen is inclined to the second alternative on the grounds that the 1886 preface claims that the 1878 author had to ‘invent’ his readership in order to compensate for his lack of fellow spirits. But this looks back in self-pity through the pain of the Rée-Lou Salomé-Nietzsche disaster of 1882. In 1872 he certainly regarded Rée, for one, as a fellow free spirit. More importantly, as I have argued in my biography, given Nietzsche’s ongoing ambition to found an intellectual-spiritual commune, a ‘monastery for free spirits’ on the model of his 1876-7 stay in Sorrento with Malwida von Meysenbug, Rée and Albert Brenner (during which much of Human was written), one should view Nietzsche’s positivism in relation to the ‘Life Reform Movement’, a general, free-spirited movement away from Victorian stuffiness and towards such things as communal living, free love, vegetarianism, dance, nudism. Human, it seems to me, is Nietzsche’s attempt to steer that movement in his own particular direction.5

Nietzsche writes that ‘a free spirit [is one] who thinks differently from what, on the basis of his origin, environment, his class and profession, or on the basis of the dominant view of the age would be expected of him’. Cohen worries that this relativity to background means that someone brought up a Quaker would have to approve of Bismarck (p. 107). But that confuses conformity with conformism: the free spirit can surely sometimes hold the same opinions as ‘fettered spirits’ (‘herd types’) - driving on the right side of the road, he can agree, is a good idea - it will just be that mostly the ‘thinking’ that gets him to those opinions will be different from that of the fettered spirit - usually simply in virtue of being thinking.

Chapter 5 addresses the central question of why free spirits are important. And one of the great merits of the book is that it gets the answer basically right. In Nietzsche’s theory of cultural evolution there is, Cohen observes, a ‘division of labour’. The ‘fettered spirits’ (the Gay Science says that they must always be in the majority) are those who protect the existing integrity of a culture, protect it from collapse into chaos. But the free spirits are crucially important because they alone protect a society from cultural ‘stagnation’, propel it forward to a ‘higher’ state. A healthy society needs both the fettered and the free. This means that Nietzsche is to be read neither as an ‘elitist’ nor as an ‘egalitarian’. He is, rather, a mixture of the two. Though the free spirits are ‘aristocrats of the soul’ (if they were not they would lack the self-confidence to stand out from the herd) they also act — with Nietzsche’s approval — for the good of society as a whole. As Cohen rightly observes, this theory of cultural health (it actually first appears in the third Untimely Meditation (UM III 6)) stayed with Nietzsche for the rest of his career.

Cohen poses the important question of just how the free spirits effect cultural transformation, why the ‘fettered’ majority follows their lead given its hatred of anyone who threatens to disturb the status quo. I do not, however, find a clear answer to the question. The real answer seems that mostly the herd does not follow the free spirit — mostly they get ‘martyred’ (GM III 9) in one way or another. Once in a while, however, there is a manifest ‘fit’ between desperate need and the novel life-form proposed by the free spirit which overcomes the innate conservatism of the fettered. (Democracy, socialism and environmentalism might be candidate examples of such life-forms. One needs to note the similarity between the free spirit and Darwin’s ‘random mutation’ to see the importance, here, of ‘desperate need’.)

Nietzsche writes: ‘a higher culture must give man a double brain, as it were two brain-ventricles, one for the perceptions of science the other for non-science’ (HH 251). This is elucidated by section 276’s remark that the ‘hall of culture’ must be large enough to accommodate ‘the arts and music’ at one end and ‘the spirit of science’ at the other. These passages lead Cohen to the odd view that whereas the free spirit is a ‘paragon of science’ the agent of a higher culture must in fact be an ‘ex-free spirit’ (p. 172), someone who has transcended the spirit of science and embraces the arts. But in my judgment the free spirit was never conceived as a paragon of scientism. The idea that he is stems from taking Human‘s positivism to be the exact affirmation of the previously despised ’Socratism’, the view that nothing other than science is needed for a flourishing life. In fact, though, Nietzsche is always clear (as, for that matter, are the ‘logical positivists’) that science alone cannot create values. But that is precisely the task of free spirits, those ‘seed bearers of the future … spiritual colonizers and shapers of new states and communities’ (GS 23).

I have disagreed with Cohen on a number of points — in, I hope, a conversational rather than querulous spirit. Let me end, however, by re-emphasising that this is an important book, thoughtful, clearly (that is, honestly) written, and utterly sound on the precedence of the published texts over the Nachlass, as well as on the need to periodize Nietzsche’s path of thinking.

1 In the following, references to Nietzsche’s works will be abbreviated as follows:

BT The Birth of Tragedy

UM Untimely Meditation

HH Human, All-too-Human

AOM Assorted Opinions and Maxims

GS The Gay Science

BGE Beyond Good and Evil

GM On the Genealogy of Morals

TI Twilight of the Idols.

Numerals refer to sections not pages, Roman numerals to parts.

2 That culture is threatened by the ‘means to culture’ (section 520) is surely a reference not to science (p. 163) but to Bismarck’s state.

3 See Julian Young, Friedrich Nietzsche: a Philosophical Biography (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2010) p. 274.

4 Compare, too, the movement of thought in the partly autobiographical ‘the true [i.e. metaphysical] world [is] now a … superfluous idea — consequently … let us abolish it’ (TI IV: my emphasis).

5 See Young (op. cit.) chapters 14.