Science in a Democratic Society

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Philip Kitcher, Science in a Democratic Society, Prometheus Books, 2011, 270pp., $28.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781616144074.

Reviewed by Matthew J. Brown, The University of Texas at Dallas


Philip Kitcher's Science in a Democratic Society makes powerful and original contributions not only to general philosophy of science, but also to ethical theory, political philosophy, social epistemology, and speculative anthropology and sociobiology. Kitcher radically extends the agenda of his earlier work, Science, Truth, and Democracy (2001), which sought to provide a framework for determining the role of values in determining the ideal research agenda for science in a democratic society. Where Science, Truth, and Democracy focused on the aims of science, Science in a Democratic Society considers the acceptance of scientific claims, their application and dissemination, and the role of diversity and dissent within science as well as public dissent about science.

Like its predecessor, Science in a Democratic Society is a landmark work merely in virtue of its existence, over and above its quality and original contributions. In 2001, Science, Truth, and Democracy helped legitimate the philosophical study of the aims of science along ethical, social, and political lines, as well as the search for the proper structure of science in a democracy. Science in a Democratic Society gives further legitimation to philosophers of science arguing that values play a deep and abiding role in every phase of the scientific process, to those calling for the deep democratization of science, and to those trying to unite philosophy of science with ethics or political philosophy. Even if much of this ground has been covered before, Kitcher's contribution marks an important step.

The introduction gives a good overview of the book's structure and motivates the core problem as "integrating expertise with democratic values" (11). The book can be divided into three parts. The first, chapters 1-4, gives the background to Kitcher's account of science in democracy. Chapter 1 sets up the problem of "the erosion of scientific authority" and gives his account of the role of value-judgments in science. Chapter 2 gives a naturalistic, progressive account of value-judgment, an abbreviated version of the account given in The Ethical Project (Kitcher 2011). Chapter 3 gives an account of democracy and democratic values that Kitcher takes to follow Dewey. Chapter 4 describes the history of "systems of public knowledge," where the traces left by pre-democratic societies gives reason to consider reforming science and its relation to society in favor of an arrangement that allows the integration of expertise with democratic values.

The second part of the book lays out Kitcher's theory, which, as in Science, Truth, and Democracy, is called "well-ordered science," but here expanded to include not only a well-ordered research agenda (chapter 5), but also well-ordered certification, i.e., acceptance of results as public knowledge (chapter 6), well-ordered access to and application of public knowledge (chapter 7), and the proper role of diversity and dissent in well-ordered science and in the society in which it is embedded (chapter 8). The final part of the book (chapter 9) applies the theory to four problems: the controversy over teaching evolution in schools, the research agenda of the biomedical sciences, worries about genetically-modified organisms, and climate change. I will focus on the first three chapters of the background and the chapters on the well-ordered research agenda and well-ordered certification in detail.

Kitcher's framing of the problem is a variation on familiar themes. We see the erosion of scientific authority in the American anti-Darwinism movement, the European opposition to GMOs, and the worldwide controversy over climate science. The problem is the result of the twin forces of scientism, which in overreaching undermines the credibility of serious science, and politicization of science by those who feel alienated by science or can profit from eroding science's authority. What we need to resolve this problem is a theory of science's place in a democratic society, which for Kitcher has two parts: (1) an account of the proper division of epistemic labor and (2) an account of how to integrate that account with democratic values. Kitcher's answer to (1) requires deference to scientific experts where appropriate, but also includes the view that when it comes to value-judgments, no one is an expert. Kitcher's answer to (2) is the main topic of the book.

The first chapter also includes an argument that science cannot and should not try to be value-free. First, as in Science, Truth, and Democracy, judgments about what research projects to pursue require value-judgments. Second, Kitcher describes Richard Rudner's (1953) argument that there are often foreseeable consequences of being right or wrong in scientific practice, and we ought, ethically, to weigh those consequences in deciding our standards for acceptance or rejection of hypotheses. Kitcher's response to the standard criticisms of Rudner's argument is fairly quick; his purpose is not to convince those who are unconvinced by the established literature on this argument. More interesting are his positive views on the role of values in science.

First, values should not act as external influences on science which are held dogmatically; rather, "commitments to factual claims and to value-judgments coevolve" (36) during the course of inquiry. Second, major scientific controversies involve value-laden disagreements, but their resolution is reasonable because as each side tries to create consistent representations and schemes of values, one side becomes untenable. The "losers" in a scientific controversy may be at fault because of the poverty of their scheme of values rather than the poor epistemic quality of their representations. Third, Kitcher rightly points out the need for clarification of our talk about "value-judgments" and "schemes of values." He offers a three-fold division of broad (ultimate goals, moral and political commitments), cognitive (general commitment to seek knowledge of a certain kind), and probative (specific problems to be solved and standards for solution) schemes of values. The broad scheme of values helps determine the cognitive scheme of values by ranking certain kinds of knowledge as more significant, but the choice to adopt a certain scheme of cognitive values can also exert pressure on the broad scheme of values. The same relations hold between cognitive and probative values.

Finally, Kitcher suggests that the motivation behind the value-free ideal is an "allergy to public value-judgment" (40). Tying the objectivity of science to freedom from values is based on the mistaken idea that value-judgments are arbitrary and subjective, the idea that value-judgment is not really a form of judgment, but merely an expression of preferences. The defenders of value-freedom refuse to give ethical standards serious weight, but in practice, no one is a complete relativist about value-judgments. This motivates Kitcher's account in chapter 2.

In order to rehabilitate value-judgment, Kitcher requires a theory that is naturalistic, allows for ethical progress, and provides substantive standards. Kitcher secures naturalism by describing the evolutionary, psychological, and anthropological foundations of the ethical project. He gives a sociobiological account of the origins of human altruism, along with a speculative anthropological account of the origin and development of ethical rules, as a kind of "social technology" for dealing with failures of altruism. Key to this story is that prehistoric tribal ethics were decided by egalitarian discussion and consensus among the group, while historical forms are more authoritarian in nature. Ethical progress according to Kitcher is progress from, i.e., progress in response to successfully resolving problems of altruism failure. The standards are determined by the Ur-democratic situation of tribal ethics, rendered in ideal terms and expanded to the "global tribe" (including future generations and, maybe, sentient animals). Kitcher proposes the following standard of Ideal Endorsement for ethical judgment:

Ethical conclusions should be accepted if and only if they would be endorsed by an ideal conversation:

  1. among all humans (and maybe sentient animals), present and future
  2. under conditions of perfect mutual engagement
  3. aimed at serious equality of opportunity for all people to have a worthwhile life.

The standard of ideal endorsement allows a novel critique of value-driven research. Research programs must have not only a record of empirical success (according to its probative scheme of values), but also a coherent relationship between probative, cognitive, and broad values. Kitcher argues it is reasonable to adopt new probative values based on one's empirical record (thus "increasing" success). Sometimes, the only thing keeping a research program alive is dogmatic adherence to a broad scheme of values, without which the cognitive and probative values needed to keep a debate alive would seem absurd. But failure of that broad scheme of values to meet the standards of ideal endorsement constitute further grounds of criticism.

Kitcher makes this point about anti-Darwinists: while they lack a well-articulated or independently compelling scheme of cognitive or even probative values capable of accommodating the empirical facts, this is not sufficient to undermine their position. The standard criticisms of intelligent design creationism on purely epistemic grounds is inadequate, on Kitcher's view, since they have a principled way of opposing the cognitive and probative values underlying the epistemic standards of mainstream science. Rather, the problem is that they have a bad (fundamentalist Christian) scheme of values, one that fails the conditions of ideal endorsement, because it lacks mutual engagement. Similar arguments could be made of the industry partisan climate denialist versus the responsible climate scientist.

Chapter 3 is in some tension with the rest of the book. Kitcher defends a quasi-Deweyan account of democracy, according to which democracy is not equivalent to the apparatus of votes and elections. He rather focuses on the democratic values (or ideals) of freedom and equality -- and one may have superficially democratic procedures that fail to fully realize the ideals of freedom and equality. (A more Deweyan account would have emphasized the importance of social communication about and cooperation on shared problems and goals.) However, much of the rest of the book contrasts vulgar democracy not with actual democratic procedures that better realize democratic values, but rather the aforementioned ideal endorsement, which not only needn't be realized by actual democratic procedures but which obviously cannot be so realized. Kitcher seems happy to allow elitism to reign, so long as it would give a good approximation of the conclusions of ideal endorsement. Dewey, on the other hand, would prefer structures of actual engagement that approximated the ideal democratic procedures, even if the results deviated significantly from the results of ideal endorsement. I do not mean that there is a contradiction in Kitcher's approach, but rather that Kitcher's attitude towards actual engagement of democracy with science is left somewhat unclear because of this tension.

Most philosophers will want to know how the new account of well-ordered science differs from the account in Science, Truth, and Democracy. Already mentioned is the expansion of the concept from research agenda to certification, application, etc. A second difference is an expansion of the role of values in determining "scientific significance," i.e., the importance of research goals. In Science, Truth, and Democracy, the determinants of significance were practical and epistemic value -- ultimately cashed out in terms of instrumental rationality and the notoriously problematic "natural curiosity." Significance could be determined by scientists as an input into determining the well-ordered research agenda. Moral and political values only came in during that later stage. In Science in a Democratic Society, the order is reversed: what is scientifically significant are those problems singled out in well-ordered science and determined according to ideal endorsement, which includes not only practical power and curiosity, but all other relevant value-judgments. While in Science, Truth, and Democracy significance attached primarily to truths as the goals of inquiry, in Science in a Democratic Society, significance attaches to problems to be solved. The "significance graphs" that played such a central role in Science, Truth, and Democracy are only mentioned in passing and have been demoted from being constitutive of significance to being a helpful communication tool that will help prevent myopic determinations of significance (this is the recommendation of Brown 2010, based on problems with the account of significance in Science, Truth, and Democracy).

The most significant and controversial extension of the theory of well-ordered science is into the context of public certification of knowledge. Defenders of value-free science may admit that the choice to follow one research project rather than another is value-laden, and though historically there has been opposition to the idea of external direction of scientific research, in the end it does not get at the heart of scientific practice, which could remain value-neutral. The last stand of value-freedom has been in the context of justification. Kitcher to some degree sidesteps the traditional arguments against value-free science by moving the battleground from the logical context of justification to the actual context of certification, where social processes certify scientific claims as public knowledge. Here he asks: does the public have a role to play in certifying scientific claims?

There are two ways in which they should, according to Kitcher: well-ordered certification and ideal transparency. Certification of a scientific claim as public knowledge requires that the relevant community of inquirers determine that the claim is true enough and significant enough. That value-judgments pervade judgments of significance has been shown in the previous chapter. Whether a claim is "true enough" depends on standards having to do with precision and accuracy -- how close the results are to the truth, and how likely the procedure is to generate truth. Value-judgments pervade these decisions (for Rudner's reasons). Well-ordered certification requires that these value-judgments pass the test of ideal endorsement. Ideal transparency has to do with whether the public can appreciate the methods of knowledge-production well enough to trust the relevant community of inquirers. Failures of transparency have much to do with the erosion of scientific authority.

One serious problem with the book is that it is profoundly disengaged. Kitcher does not write in conversation with the contemporary philosophers of science working in the areas he's touching. Whether it is because Kitcher is laying foundations for a new approach or is "writing for the ages" rather than getting caught up in petty squabbling amongst professional philosophers, this disengagement is the trait of the book most likely to annoy other philosophers of science. I will give a few notable examples where better engagement is needed.

Though Science in a Democratic Society is meant as a successor to the earlier Science, Truth, and Democracy, Kitcher does not address specific criticisms of his book from the various philosophers and other scholars who have reviewed or critiqued the book. Section 19 in chapter 5, however, purports to respond to "common objections" to the theory of well-ordered science without naming the sources of those objections (he does make a brief reference to a review by Richard Lewontin (2002) on p. 125). Kitcher has clearly altered his views, but if it is in response to pressures of criticism, he gives us little clue.

The book tackles "integrating expertise with democratic values," but does not engage the recent literature on expertise, e.g. the work stemming from Collins and Evans (2007). It offers a new approach to values in science, but does not engage in any depth with the scholars who have been working on that problem for several decades now. When discussing Rudner's argument that value-judgment is a necessary component of science, Kitcher fails to give credit to the work of Heather Douglas (2000, 2009), though she is responsible for giving that argument new life. (Kitcher does cite Douglas (2009) a few pages later on a related point.) Likewise, though his account of levels of values is clearly an attempted refinement of Longino's contextual-constitutive values distinction, he does not cite her.

This leads to the problem that it is unclear who, exactly, is the audience for the book. It is too technical for a general audience or policymakers, not because the examples from science, which Kitcher always explains clearly, but because at several points he chooses to present philosophical arguments in terms of formal probability theory. Most philosophers or statistically-trained scientists can easily follow these arguments, but the book is too disengaged to please philosophers of science. I suspect it also presupposes too much knowledge and vocabulary from classic philosophy of science to be easy reading for scientists, and this will of course also be a problem for general audiences. Perhaps students in philosophy of science would be the best audience, but because of the failures of engagement, it will be somewhat misleading as an introduction to these issues. Finally, I found the Index frustratingly incomplete.

Criticisms aside, Science in a Democratic Society remains an important contribution to the literature on science, values, and democracy. It thoroughly and clearly articulates a democratic ideal for society and for science in society, and gives practical recommendations following from that ideal. I have only been able to describe in detail a small part of the richness of the book. Philosophers dealing with these issues will be examining and evaluating it for years to come.


M. J. Brown. Genuine Problems and the Significance of Science. Contemporary Pragmatism, 7(2):131-153, 2010.

H. Collins and R. Evans. Rethinking Expertise. University of Chicago Press, Chicago, 2007.

H. Douglas. Inductive risk and values in science. Philosophy of Science, 67(4):559-579, 2000.

H. Douglas. Science, Policy, and the Value-Free Ideal. University of Pittsburgh Press, Pittsburgh, 2009.

P. Kitcher. Science, Truth, and Democracy. Oxford University Press, 2001.

P. Kitcher. The Ethical Project. Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass., 2011.

R. C. Lewontin. The politics of science. New York Review of Books, May 9 2002.

H. E. Longino. Science as social knowledge: values and objectivity in scientific inquiry. Princeton University Press, Princeton, N.J., 1990.

R. Rudner. The scientist qua scientist makes value judgments. Philosophy of Science, 20(1):1-6.