Science in the Age of Computer Simulation

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Eric Winsberg, Science in the Age of Computer Simulation, University of Chicago Press, 2010, 152pp., $24.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226902043.

Reviewed by Isabelle Peschard, San Francisco State University


Computer simulations have become a major source of information all over the scientific landscape, often used instead of experimentation to investigate phenomena. Until recently, however, they have received very little attention from philosophers of science.

For more than a decade, Eric Winsberg has been a pioneer in the development of philosophy of simulation as a new discipline in philosophy of science, and he has published numerous groundbreaking articles on the topic. This book of eight chapters (including introduction and conclusion) is based on a selection of papers edited into a coherent narrative that offers a stimulating philosophical introduction to the methodology and epistemology of simulation.

How do simulations work, under what conditions are they reliable, and what is the nature of the results they produce? Is it knowledge at all? These are among the main questions Winsberg tackles in this book, although certainly not the only ones.

Winsberg succeeds -- in a style that is clear and engaging, with the help of fitting case studies, skillfully stripped of side-tracking technicalities -- in making clear that simulations raise new and serious issues, methodological and epistemological, for philosophy of science. Among these issues are the relationship between simulation results and the theoretical principles used to construct the simulation model, whether experimentation has some epistemological priority or superiority over simulation, how simulation results are justified and whether their evaluation is value free.

But Winsberg also has some persuasive arguments that philosophy of simulation may offer a novel and fecund perspective on classical themes in philosophy of science, like the inference from success to truth (which he shows to be unwarranted) or the fictional character of models (which he denies while stressing the role of fictions in modeling).

Chapter 1 is a brief introduction to the general motivation and project of the book. Winsberg diagnoses the lack of interest for simulations as an effect of the epistemic presumption, much decried recently in the developing philosophy of scientific practice, that applying theories is merely revealing the knowledge that they somehow already contain and raises only technical issues. Simulations, Winsberg counters, involve application of theories in a complex and creative way, resulting in what deserves to be called 'new knowledge'. The claim will be explicated, supported and defended throughout the other chapters.

Chapter 2 is a dense introduction to the methodology of simulation and its epistemic and epistemological implications. The explication of the methodology highlights two main features. Simulation is not a linear process leading from theoretical principles to simulation results, but rather a process of trial and adjustments among theoretical model, simulation model, and results. Theoretical principles are only one source of the mathematics involved in the simulation; other sources are the introduction of approximations and (sometimes) terms with no theoretical ground and no function other than to make up for some of these approximations. (An example Winsberg describes is the role of the term 'eddy viscosity' in astrophysical simulations.)

These two points open up two central issues. First, they raise the issue of the justification of the simulation results while challenging an epistemological approach that is centered on the original equations and separates the problems of verification and validation. That approach, Winsberg argues, misidentifies the real problem of the simulationist and misrepresents her epistemological strategy. The real problem is not whether the simulation produces solutions to the original equations; it is whether the results of the simulation are empirically informative. It is a problem similar to that of the experimenter, and his strategy is also similar in many ways. This similarity will be the object of the next chapter.

The second issue is epistemic: Should these results be seen as revealing the content of the theoretical principles? Here Winsberg gestures towards a negative answer and the view that the results may constitute 'genuinely novel knowledge'. Winsberg doesn't argue for the claim and the issue will be taken up again in other chapters.

But something remains unclear. The claim that theoretical models do not uncover the content of the theoretical principles guiding their construction has been made already, independently of simulation (e.g., Cartwright et al. 1995). What is not clear then is whether simulations are supposed to uncover the content of the theoretical models that are used for the construction of the simulation models. If they do, the study of simulations doesn't motivate a new claim of novel knowledge, even though it may provide new support for it. If the claim is a new one, then what is it exactly? Is it that simulation models are somehow autonomous from theoretical models, as theoretical models are from theoretical principles?

Chapter 3 focuses on the epistemological similarities between simulation and experimentation. Winsberg briefly reviews some previous studies that have dismissed the view of simulation as merely number-crunching processes or promoted a view of simulation as experimental procedure. His own approach distinguishes itself by its specific concern with the justification of simulation results. The creative dimension of the modeling process prevents the justification from flowing from the theoretical principles, and comparison with real data is not always possible. Winsberg succeeds in making conspicuous the similarity between the simulationist's and experimenter's epistemological situations and methods to provide credentials for their results: the simulationist will check her results against other trusted results, theoretical or empirical, and rely on previous models, skills and techniques selected by their previous success. And Winsberg is right that these similarities "illuminate our understanding of the application of theories" (p. 30).

But, as always, new questions arise: why are there such similarities? Is it because simulation is a form of experimentation? The experimental techniques used in experimentation seem to presuppose a distinction between the system investigated and experimented on, which is manipulated and probed, and the instruments used to perform these actions. But it is not clear how such a line could be drawn in simulation, where what is experimented on seems to be the same as the instrument of investigation, that is, the simulation model, and what is investigated, the world, is not what is experimented on.

Chapter 4 offers an answer to the questions that were just raised. According to Winsberg, both experimentation and simulation consist in the manipulation of an object that stands in for the system of interest: it will be a physical system in experimentation, a model in simulation. In both cases, information about the system of interest is obtained indirectly as the product of an inference from the results of the manipulation.

Winsberg carefully resists prior attempts to dismiss, on this basis, the distinction between experimentation and simulation. Instead, he proposes an epistemological distinction in terms of what serves as the basis for the reliability of the inference. With simulation, it is trust in the simulation model and the different elements involved in its construction (theoretical principles, tricks and physical intuitions). With experimentation, it will be reasons to regard the object manipulated and the system of interest as being, in relevant ways, the same kind of material system. (Here Winsberg remains rather vague). Given that one basis is not, as a matter of principle, more secure than the other, "experiments", Winsberg concludes, "are [not] epistemically privileged relative to simulations" (p. 70).

This is a penetrating and compelling account, so long as one focuses on the use of experimentation to gain information about a system without experimenting on it. But this use of experimentation should not be conflated with experimentation itself. Experimentation is, in the first place, a means to learn about a system by experimenting on it, that is, by manipulating it. It is true that, in general, as Mary Morgan (2003) pointed out, we want the system experimented on to be representative of a certain class of system, that is, as Morgan says, made 'of the same stuff' -- but that is different from being a representation. In particular, even though experimentation is certainly no less fallible than simulation, it may have a direct, non-inferential access to the system under investigation. Wouldn't that directness confer an epistemic privilege?

Chapter 5 offers an original view on fictions in science, based on an exciting case study in nanoscience where the simulation requires different levels of description (atomic, molecular, macroscopic) for different regions of the system simulated. Hence, simulating the system as a whole entails finding a method to articulate the different descriptions.

The method involves the positing of atoms with unrealistic properties, called 'silogens', which seems to make the model of this system a mere fiction. But Winsberg's account of fiction aims precisely at saving this, and most scientific models, from counting as fiction. On his account, only models offered with no promise of being a reliable guide to the behavior of the system they represent, like a fable and like the model of silogen, may count as fictions. The model of the system as a whole would not count as fiction since it is offered as a reliable guide to the behavior of this system.

This account aptly emphasizes the intended function of models. But Winsberg's example of literary fiction is a fable, and his examples of scientific fictions in this and other chapters -- silogens, artificial viscosity -- are more like fables than novels. Like a fable, in contrast to a novel, it is not just that their intended function is not representational, it seems to be also assumed that they could not sustain such a function.

So one may suspect that what makes them fictions is not just that they are not offered as reliable representations and have a non-representational intended function, it is also that they are offered as non-reliable as representations. (More on fictions later.)

Chapter 6 argues against the idea that only so-called epistemic values influence the appraisal of scientific hypotheses by considering the assessment of uncertainties in climate change modeling. I cannot do justice to the details of the argument but here are the basic ideas. Because of uncertainties regarding the approximations and parameterization schemes used in the models, the measure of the uncertainty of the knowledge of the climate system must be based on the results from an ensemble of models. The estimation of this epistemic uncertainty will depend on the size of the dispersion in the results, which itself depends on what the models are like. But what models are like, in turn, strongly depends on how they were constructed. Winsberg's point is that the construction of the models was influenced by the focus on one particular task: predicting changes in global mean surface temperature. This explains why the dispersion is smaller for this task than for others, such as predicting the precipitation. But the motivation behind the selection of this task as yard-stick of the evaluation has a non-epistemic dimension: its social, political and economical significance.

Whereas it is generally admitted that non-epistemic values influence the selection of problems, it is also generally claimed that they do not influence the answer to the problem. However, if the problem is the uncertainty of our knowledge of the climate system, then the answer is clearly influenced by non-epistemic values.

One may object that, given the models that we have, the assessment of the uncertainty of the evolution of the different quantities, at least, is not influenced by non-epistemic values. But even that, Winsberg replies, is not correct because we are now led to understate the uncertainty on the temperature and overstate the uncertainty on the other quantities.

Chapter 7 challenges the inference from the success of a representation to its truth. The argument is based on the use of fictional representations in successful simulations. Winsberg is aware that truth or approximate truth is not supposed to explain just any sort of success. In particular, the representation should be 'projectible', successful in a variety of applications, and play a crucial role in the success of the application. But Winsberg contends that there are some fictional representations, like artificial viscosity, that satisfy all the conditions for the inference and do not correspond to anything.

A natural objection is that it is the model as a whole that is successful. But it is artificial viscosity, Winsberg replies, that is projectible and used in various models to simulate systems of different nature. Artificial viscosity "has its own degree of success and trustworthiness" (p. 132) and the success of this fiction cannot be explained by truth. Instead, it should be regarded as a mark of its reliability, where reliability, following Arthur Fine, is meant as an alternative to truth (rather than a means for truth).

Still, one may doubt that artificial viscosity is really a candidate for truth in the first place, since Winsberg himself speaks of it as a model building technique. Aren't fictional representations rather like discretization methods, which inherit their trustworthiness from the success of the simulation they are used to produce? The crucial difference, though, according to Winsberg, is that artificial viscosity can be interpreted as a representation of viscosity, which happens to be unrealistic.

It is unclear, however, that the same thing could be, on Winsberg's account, both a candidate for truth and a fiction (see the discussion of chapter 5). More generally, it is not clear that, as a technique, it can be regarded as playing a crucial role in the success of the simulations. It may well be currently indispensable, but couldn't a new technique be developed that will render it superfluous?

To conclude, the book is relatively short and easy reading, but it is anything but a book of short answers or meager content -- which altogether makes it a great basis for a graduate seminar. It is rich with challenging and thought-provoking views on numerous important questions in philosophy of science, and it offers a genuinely instructive and illuminating contribution to the philosophy of simulation.


Cartwright, N., Shomar, T., & Suรกrez, M. (1995) The tool box of science. In W. Herfel, W. Krajewski, I. Niiniluoto, & R. Wojcicki (eds.), Theories and models in scientific processes, Amsterdam: Rodopi: 137-149.

Morgan, M., (2003) Experiments without Material Intervention: Model Experiments, Virtual Experiments, and Virtually Experiments. In H. Radder (ed.), The philosophy of scientific experimentation, Pittsburg, PA: University of Pittsburg Press: 216-235.