Science, Politics, and Evolution

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Elisabeth A. Lloyd, Science, Politics, and Evolution, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 301pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521865708.

Reviewed by Stephen Crowley, Boise State University


Science, Politics, and Evolution constitutes a retrospective of Elisabeth Lloyd's work in the philosophy of science over the last twenty-five years. The book contains twelve papers, two published for the first time, along with a combined bibliography and a serviceable index. The papers fall naturally into four groups. The first is on Lloyd's work concerning the semantic view of theories. Next is her outstanding work on the 'units of selection' debate. Following this there is a set of papers on the challenges of deploying evolutionary/genetic arguments in other areas of science. Finally there is a pair of papers addressing the resistance to feminist analyses of science.

Individually the papers range from the first-rate to the classic (e.g. "Units and Levels of Selection" which set the bar for analyses of this set of evolutionary biological issues). As a collection they both display the development of an influential approach to philosophy of science in the hands of one of that approach’s leading practitioners and also illuminate central features of Lloyd's philosophizing (her methods and focal concerns). It is unfortunate therefore that the book lacks any form of introduction, leaving the identification of the text's synergistic features in the hands of the reader rather than offering any form of guidance to the key themes of Lloyd's work.

In what follows I highlight briefly what we are offered and speculate on a couple of themes that seem of significance to me.

I. Science

Papers 1-3: "The Nature of Darwin's Support for the Theory of Natural Selection" (henceforth NDS), "A Semantic Approach to the Structure of Population Genetics" (SAPG), and "Confirmation of Ecological and Evolutionary Models" (CEEM).

This is Lloyd's early work, dating from the first half of the 1980's. Its unifying theme is the attempt to work out how best to present and evaluate scientific theories. Lloyd was an early proponent of the semantic view of theories, the view that a scientific theory is better understood as a set of models than as an axiomatic (laws of nature) structure.

The semantic view is taken for granted in these papers which focus on particular challenges to adopting that perspective. NDS approaches this challenge from a historical point of view -- arguing that Darwin's support for his theory is far more empirical and less pragmatic than was thought at the time (1980's). According to Lloyd, adopting the semantic view is a crucial step in recognizing that Darwin is not using 'inference to the best explanation' but rather a diversity of evidential strategies in his work. SAPG, while officially addressing various philosophical challenges to understanding population genetics using the semantic approach, ends up highlighting the fact that these challenges are challenges for population genetics itself as much as for any philosophical theory of the subject. Furthermore these challenges are both comprehensible and likely to be soluble from the semantic perspective, in contrast to the covering law approach which struggles to even articulate the issues at hand. Finally, CEEM returns to the questions about evidence for a theory (considered as a set of models) that arose in NDS and points out that standards of evidence parallel to those deployed by Darwin remain appropriate in current work on evolution and ecology.

While it is certainly valuable to have the opportunity to survey this material as a whole, its central concerns are addressed in a richer and more coherent fashion in Lloyd's first book The Structure and Confirmation of Evolutionary Theory (1994 Princeton University Press).

II. Evolution

Papers 4-7: "Units and Levels of Selection" (ULS), "Species Selection on Variability" -- co-author Stephen Jay Gould (SS), "An Open Letter to Elliot Sober and David Sloan Wilson, Regarding Their Book, Unto Others: The Evolution and Psychology of Unselfish Behavior" (OL), and "Problems with Pluralism" (PP).

The four papers in this group all address, in one way or another, the question: what is it that evolves? Discussion of this question, the units and levels of selection debate, has been, and remains, a major focus of interest within both biology and the philosophy of biology. Lloyd's contributions to this debate are substantial and on-going; the two previously un-published pieces in this collection both appear in this group.

In ULS Lloyd sets out a framework for the analysis of the 'units and levels' debate. According to Lloyd, analyzing the process of evolution by means of natural selection may lead to wonder about a) the replicator (the thing which is copied from one generation to the next), b) the interactor (the thing whose fit with the environment determines differential re-production of replicators), c) the beneficiary (the entity that benefits as a result of adaptations), and d) the manifestor (the entity that actually has the adaptation). To complete her analysis Lloyd points out that there is a systematic ambiguity in the notion of 'adaptation' which can be used to describe either a) any product of a process of selection or b) a trait which provides its possessor (all else being equal) with a reproductive advantage in virtue of clear structural and/or functional features of the trait (what Lloyd calls the 'engineering view'). By appealing to this framework Lloyd makes a compelling case that much of the disagreement in the 'units and levels' debate is the result of miscommunication, with different researchers pursuing distinct combinations of her four questions.

While both SS and OL are rich papers in their own right they can also be seen as the working out of particular issues/opportunities that arise from the ULS analysis. The key point in both papers is that an entity can be an interactor without being a manifestor (if the engineering view of adaptation is adopted). One consequence of this 'interactor but not manifestor' option is that entities such as species can be seen to operate in the interactor role without there being any adaptation manifested by the entity in question. This is the point that Lloyd and Gould make in SS. A further consequence of the 'interactor but not manifestor' option is that folk who are interested in the manifestor question will not regard groups as interesting since they are only interactors. This is the point Lloyd makes in OL in an attempt to clarify why the debates between Sober and Wilson and their critics have not been more productive.

The discussion thus far takes it for granted that there is some fact of the matter about the way in which some episode of selection occurs (i.e. there is a real issue of which units and levels of selection are operational in the episode in question). This assumption has come into question as a result of the work of philosophers such as Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters. Their work, which establishes a formal (i.e. mathematical) equivalence between multi-level selection models and models where all selection occurs at the genetic level, has been taken as evidence that the distinction between levels of selection is a purely conventional one. In PP Lloyd argues against this conventionalist attitude. Lloyd challenges the conventionalist story on two grounds. First she suggests that there are serious limitations to the equivalence of genetic level and multi-level models. Second, she suggests that since the genetic-level models are derivative from the multi-level models (they 'borrow' level type information and convert it into environment type information) they do not in fact show the levels question to be conventional -- at most they establish that there are alternative ways of describing the situation, but that is a shallow rather than a deep form of conventionalism and not one that ought be taken to undermine the empirical significance of the levels debates.

Lloyd's work is not without its problems. I think Sober and Wilson are right to worry about the coherence of the engineering view of adaptation. Nonetheless her contribution to the levels debates is first rate. So it is a real benefit to finally have so much of it gathered together in a single volume where its coherence and quality can be appreciated. Lloyd's account is sensitive to the science -- not merely the results but also the process. Furthermore, it analyzes rather than takes sides -- we get an account of the concepts in use rather than an attempt to legislate which concept ought to be used. The openness of biologists to Lloyd's approach suggests that it is a model of the way in which philosophers can contribute to the relevant science at the same time as undertaking philosophical work of the first quality.

III. Science and Evolution

Papers 8, 9 and 12: "Normality and Variation: The Human Genome Project and the Ideal Human Type" (NV), "Evolutionary Psychology: The Burdens of Proof" (EP), and "Pre-Theoretical Assumptions in Evolutionary Explanations of Female Sexuality" (EEFO).

In each of these papers Lloyd addresses the challenges that arise in attempting to apply results from one branch of the life sciences to questions in another area of those sciences.

In NV Lloyd points out that the notions of abnormality and dis-function used in causal/genetic accounts of a phenotypic trait are importantly different from the concepts operating under the same labels in most medical research. This is because in medicine notions such as abnormality apply at the level of the phenotype (i.e. as properties or functions of organisms or organs, e.g. symptoms), not at the level of the gene or genotype. Hence, it is quite possible that a particular genetic pathway may be both non-standard ('abnormal' at the genetic level) and yet yield a perfectly functional organ ('normal' at the medical level). As a result it would be a mistake to use genetic notions of abnormality in medical situations without an appropriate form of translation. Lacking such a translation the notion of genetic medicine must be regarded as premature.

In EP the issue under discussion is the existence or lack of evidence, of an evolutionary character, for alternative accounts of psychological phenomena such as the content effect on the Wason selection task. In particular Lloyd is critical of theorists such as Cosmides and Toobey who argue for the superiority of their psychological theory on the basis of its evolutionary character without doing much more than asserting that the theory has such a character.

Finally in EEFO Lloyd argues that attempts to give an evolutionary account of female orgasm fail to pay sufficient attention to relevant work in sexology. This work has subsequently been substantially expanded and enriched in Lloyd's The Case of the Female Orgasm: Bias in the Science of Evolution (2005 Harvard University Press).

Seeing this set of papers as a group is of particular value. Individually they can appear to be making merely negative points about the current state of a particular area of inquiry. If we view each individually, there is a temptation to 'shrug off' Lloyd's points -- that is, to acknowledge them but dismiss their import by suggesting that her worries are merely temporary features of the science that will inevitably be 'tidied' up as time goes by. Such a 'shrugging off' would be a mistake on a number of levels. Science does not always repair its mistakes; see EEFO. Furthermore, when it does, it does so in response to having those mistakes pointed out. This means Lloyd's work has value at that level if no other! However the central error is in seeing Lloyd's work as merely critical in nature. These papers are critical as a means to an end; their main focus in on how to pursue the inquiries in question in a productive fashion. By indicating the ways in which combining two forms of inquiry in a simplistic fashion leads to error, Lloyd is pointing the way to more adequate forms of combination. This valuable, positive aspect of Lloyd's work is much clearer when the papers making up this group are considered as a whole rather than individually.

IV. Politics

Papers 10 and 11: "Objectivity and the Double Standard for Feminist Epistemologies" (DS), and "Science and Anti-Science: Objectivity and Its Real Enemies" (SAS).

The most salient feature of this cluster is the attempt to analyze the powerful negative response to feminist science studies that was prevalent in the early 90's. Lloyd develops a 'big picture' account of this material in SAS and focuses on a single particularly philosophic aspect (objectivity) in DS.

In SAS Lloyd begins by giving an account of the criticisms leveled at science studies in general from within science itself (the authors of this material are labeled the 'critics'). In Lloyd's view these criticisms are best understood as the result of a political dilemma. On the one hand the scientific community benefits from critical evaluation; this is the essence of its progressive nature. But science is also a powerful force for social good, one whose capacity for producing such goods may be undermined by criticism. In Lloyd's view the critics are guilty of a lack of discernment, of failing to distinguish beneficial criticism generated by science studies from destructive criticism connected with religious fundamentalism and superstition. The focus of this paper is not, however, the status of the critics' work -- Lloyd establishes its weakness expeditiously. Rather Lloyd is interested in the means by which the critics attempt to make their case. Lloyd argues that the critics proceed by excluding/discrediting their opponents (section 2) and that they achieve this end by implicitly assuming that external (science studies) and internal (science) explanations are mutually exclusive and do not overlap (section 3). As Lloyd points out, this view of explanation is not justified. In section 5 Lloyd addresses in detail some of the ways that feminist work in particular has been excluded/discredited. Of central importance is the claim that feminist work is not objective -- a topic that is the focus of DS.

In DS Lloyd argues that the objective nature of science is consistent with the possibility that sex/gender based structures may impact science. Lloyd identifies a variety of 'objectivities' ranging from the purely ontological (what is really real) through the complex (objectivity as observer independent and/or publicly accessible) to the purely epistemic (a maximally disinterested/unbiased observer). Feminist, and other social/cultural influences, are irrelevant to science only on the epistemic reading of objectivity, but it is the ontological reading that is primary. This is not the end of the analysis, however. Lloyd argues that much of philosophy is in the grip of an 'ontological tyranny' in which ontological objectivity is achievable only via epistemic objectivity. Ontological tyranny therefore justifies the view that sex/gender structures are irrelevant to science. Lloyd, however, points out that neither the original motives for adopting the tyranny nor current philosophical accounts of objectivity provide current support for the tyranny. There is, therefore, no reason to accept such tyranny or the view that sex/gender is irrelevant to science.

DS is another fine example of Lloyd's ability to provide insight by means of thorough and penetrating descriptions of contested conceptual landscapes. As such it provides strong support for Lloyd's analysis in SAS. The problem for SAS lies elsewhere. Although Lloyd is correct to chastise the critics for simply asserting the incompatibility of internal and external explanations, her claim that the two forms are compatible does not resolve the genuine puzzles concerning just how such compatibility is to be achieved.

Overall, the papers is this group, like the others in the collection, display clearly Lloyd's insight that there are rich philosophical rewards for those prepared to pay careful attention to the details of science's conceptual landscape.