Science Transformed? Debating Claims of an Epochal Break

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Alfred Nordmann, Hans Radder, and Gregor Schiemann (eds.), Science Transformed? Debating Claims of an Epochal Break, University of Pittsburgh Press, 2011, 222pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822961635.

Reviewed by Peter Taylor, University of Massachusetts Boston


We can judge this book by its cover. "Advances in computing, instrumentation, robotics, digital imaging, and simulation modeling have changed science into a technology-driven institution." This is the epochal break. Or perhaps it is not. The description continues: "The pragmatic interests of government, industry, and society increasingly exert their influence over science." Is the epochal break that science is now policy-, commercial-, or application-driven? Whatever defines the break, there has been, according to the leading blurb, a "profound transformation of science, technology, and society [over] the past few decades." Yet the second blurb applauds the book for "unveiling the complexity behind the fashionable rhetoric." Like the cover, the book as a whole can be characterized by disparate framings -- changes in science or in applications; a real or rhetorical break -- that pull readers in different directions.

Despite -- or because of -- the conflicting framings, readers will find in the collected essays an engaging range of issues. In the book's first half, the meaning and significance of claims of epochal break are examined from many angles: the rise of the "regime of technoscience" (Alfred Nordmann, one of the editors who finds the break to be real); positioning current trends as extensions of developments already underway in the nineteenth century (Gregor Schiemann, an editor critiquing claims of an epochal break); science now delivering on what it always sought, namely, remaking the world (Martin Carrier); the interests served by claims about epochal breaks (Cyrus C. M. Mody); models as independent objects that one learns from by interacting with -- that is, representing is bound with intervening (Mieke Boon and Tarja Knuuttila); positioning current trends as extensions of developments already underway in the Renaissance (Hans Radder, the third editor also reserved about claims of an epochal break); periodisation of changes in science and technology since World War II (Andrew Jamison); and design as the technological "style" (extending Crosbie's six styles of science) (Chunglin Kwa).

The book's second half consists of cases from recent science: changes in the meaning of experimentation so that it includes field experiments (Astrid Schwarz and Wolfgang Krohn); implications of increased use of digital images in science -- an intensification, not a transformation (Valerie Hanson); implications of digital technologies -- a fundamental change (Angela Krewani); human-robot interactions as challenge to the meaning of being human (Jutta Weber); clinical trials of drugs as an instance of scientific quality declining under commercial pressure (James Robert Brown); and the "new culture of prediction" that has followed the advent of personal computing (Ann Johnson and Johannes Lenhard).

Radder's epilogue briefly reviews six "sticking points" about the epochal break thesis, such as the normative question of whether the alleged shift from science to technologically or pragmatically driven science is desirable on social or moral grounds and the question of what historical methodology is needed to demonstrate that a break has occurred. Let me use the rest of the review to extend Radder's questions in ways that close off some issues about the interpretation of science and open up others.

First, let me question the second version of the epochal break thesis. As the back cover states, for a long, long time, "the pragmatic interests of government, industry, and society [have] exert[ed] their influence over science" (or its historical precursors). In 1669, Newton wrote instructions for a colleague about to travel in Europe, which, as summarized by the Soviet historian, Boris Hessen (1931), included:

  1. Thoroughly study the mechanism of steering and the methods of navigating ships.
  2. Survey carefully all the fortresses he should happen upon, their method of construction, their power of resistance, their defence advantages, and in general to acquaint himself with military organisation.
  3. Study the natural resources of the country, especially the metals and minerals, and also to acquaint himself with the methods of their production and refinement.
  4. Study the methods of obtaining metals from ores.
  5. Find out whether it was true that in Hungary, Slovakia and Bohemia, near the town of Eila or in the Bohemian mountains not far from Silesia, there were rivers whose waters contained gold.

Now fast forward to the 1800s:

  1. The foundational principles of genetics were laid down by Gregor Mendel working in a monastery in the capital of Moravia. "Monastery" conveys a sense of Mendel as a patient and solitary researcher. But, in fact, he had been accepted into the monastery in 1843 by an abbot who was one of the members of the Sheep Breeders' Society, which, by the 1830s, had "defined and focused on heredity as the central research goal" in the search for "a reliable basis for breeding" (Orel and Wood 2000). Moravia was no backwater in the studies of heredity and its applications.
  2. The nineteenth-century German zoologist Karl Möbius was the first to theorise the interactions among organisms in what the English world now calls an ecosystem, but which, following Möbius, many European ecologists call a biocenose. His theoretical contributions to ecology arose from his studies of oyster banks with a view to farming them commercially.
  3. In the United States, the 1862 Morrill Act established land-grant colleges, which initiated a tradition of government-funded agricultural research that pre-dated by 80 years the growth during and after World War II of federally funded science and technology. Such research not only feeds into regular journals, but into an enormous area of "grey literature" of reports from research commissioned by governments and associated institutions.

In short, in regard to "pragmatic interests of government, industry, and society . . . exert[ing] their influence over science," an epochal break is implausible -- unless one defines "science" to exclude the grey literature or, even more drastically, to exclude research that does not interest those who, in Nordmann's words, "care about science and its deep connection to modernity and the Enlightenment project" (p. 20). Such demarcation of science from some other, unnamed pursuit, one that is more applied, assumes the truth of the thesis. The only open question for me is whether the pragmatic influence is increasing. It would be hard, however, to develop a historical methodology to demonstrate such a trend; that challenge is not taken up in the book's essays.

A similar set of objections could be made to the other version of the epochal thesis, namely, that "advances in computing, instrumentation, robotics, digital imaging, and simulation modeling have changed science into a technology-driven institution." This version does, however, have the virtue of intersecting with a long-standing but recently more active area in the history and sociology of science -- but not yet in the philosophy of science -- namely, infrastructure studies (Edwards 2003). From sewers to archives, internet protocols to building standards, checklists to patient advocacy groups, high-stakes testing to citizen science projects, remote sensing networks to wireless towers, this field asks how infrastructures get envisaged, promoted, built, maintained, and abandoned in the material and discursive worlds around science and technology. Moreover, it also asks what possibilities and constraints people experience as they attempt to take action while unavoidably enmeshed in intersecting infrastructures.

This last question especially interests me. In practice -- as a scientist (who has contributed to the grey literature as well as to journals of mathematical theory), as an interpreter of science, and as a teacher and facilitator of interactions that link science with its interpretation -- I find it fruitful to ask: "How difficult would it be (or would it have been) to modify what counts as established knowledge or an effective technology?" From this vantage point, "fashionable rhetoric" about epochal breaks, as well as trends in the directions emphasized by that thesis, becomes just part of the complexity of considerations we face in engaging with scientific, technological and social change. Science Transformed? is an admirable move by (primarily) philosophers of science to step into the social studies of science, but not an epochal break.

References Cited

Edwards, P. N. (2003). "Infrastructure and modernity: Force, time, and social organization in the history of sociotechnical systems," pp 185-225 in T. J. Misa, P. Brey and A. Feenberg eds. Modernity and Technology. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Hessen, B. M. (1971 [1931]). "The social and economic roots of Newton's Principia," pp. 149-212 in N. I. Bukharin, ed., Science at the Crossroads. London: Frank Cass.

Orel, V. and R. Wood (2000). "Scientific animal breeding in Moravia before and after the rediscovery of Mendel's theory." Quarterly Review of Biology 75(2): 149-157.