Science Unlimited? The Challenges of Scientism

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Maarten Boudry and Massimo Pigliucci (eds.), Science Unlimited?  The Challenges of Scientism, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 320pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226498003.

Reviewed by John Dupré, University of Exeter


I found it surprising, if not disturbing, to find that an edited volume on a specific topic should have the chapters arranged in alphabetical order of authors' names. Surely if a topic is worth such a volume there must be some structure to the debate, a range of positions, arguments for and against, and so on, suggesting a rational, if not unique, arrangement of the material? At any rate, the lack of any such structure did bring to this reader's mind a question whether the topic was too amorphous to be well-suited to such an edited volume, a question on which I was not in the end fully reassured.

The most general question these essays address is whether there are limits to the scope of science, or pathways to knowledge distinct from science. Scientism is then understood as the thesis that there are no such limits. An immediate problem is that surely no sensible person could deny this. Even putting aside the controversial cases -- mathematics, morality, God, the humanities -- of which more later, surely people entirely innocent of scientific knowledge may have a good deal of perfectly reputable knowledge, about their environments, their friends and family, their history, and lots more? One might imagine that such knowledge could in principle become scientific knowledge. But the sheer specificity of my knowledge that, say, my cat's name is Hector, or that he likes to kill, but not eat, rabbits, seems deeply non-scientific. Science may explain how cats are equipped to kill and eat rabbits; but the specific developmental history that leads a particular cat to be disposed to do one or both seems unlikely to be of scientific interest.

Even if no one quite denies that there are some limits to science, not for the first time Alex Rosenberg does an admirable job of rebutting the claim that the argument assumes a straw man. As he begins his contribution to the volume:

For scientism most of metaphysics is easy. Almost all of it can pretty much be read off of science: the physical facts fix all the facts. There is no meaning of the universe, life and lives have no purpose, the mind is the brain, there is no free will or soul or even a numerically identical self for that matter. Scientism makes equally short work of the normative realm . . . [No] ethical theory is grounded more firmly than any other, and whichever one humans adopt is a matter of natural and cultural Darwinian selection. (p. 203)

This is a scientism that Rosenberg embraces and that captures many of the ideas that critics of scientism are concerned to oppose. It should be noted that while many philosophers agree with Rosenberg that the physical facts fix all the facts, many such philosophers deny that this has the consequences that Rosenberg adduces. One such argument is presented in this book by Filip Buekens.

More modest defenders of scientism argue not from the sufficiency of physics, but from the lack of any boundaries that separate science from any other enquiries. Maarten Boudry argues against any discontinuity between the methods of science and the methods of other effective modes of intervention in the world: "it would certainly be a peculiar use of language to call my humble plumber a scientist, but then again, it would be strange to think that any point of epistemological interest hinges on withholding that status from him" (p. 37).

Other authors object to the use of scientism as a term of criticism. Mariam Thalos endorses a reading of Aristotle as identifying science with theoretical knowledge. There are no interesting boundaries between science and some other kind of knowledge, only within science. Thalos also endorses a sharp Aristotelian distinction between theoretical and practical knowledge, so although she objects to boundary patrols within science, I am not sure why she shouldn't recognise "scientism" as an appropriate term for transgressing the boundary between the theoretical and the practical. Similarly, Don Ross advocates a broad view of science as incorporating a variety of methodologies, and is particularly concerned to defend economics from accusations of scientism. Indeed, in the end he decides that economics isn't as different from physics as is generally supposed (p. 238). But neither of these authors appears to be committed to thinking that all knowledge is science or, therefore, to rejecting all possible accusations of scientism.

Most of the contributors identify specific areas where science should not or cannot go, and hence areas that present objectionable opportunities for scientism. Morality is identified as outside the pale of science by several contributors, in some detail by Taner Edis and Justin Kalef. Some authors, including Russell Blackford and Philip Kitcher, offer a more general defence of the humanities against inappropriate encroachments from the purportedly scientific. Stephen Law and Tom Sorell both defend philosophy as conceptual analysis as a source of knowledge distinct from science, though Law is explicit about the modest ambitions of philosophy so conceived, and Sorell is careful to insist that proper conceptual analysis must take account of empirical fact. Law, rather unexpectedly, invokes Richard Dawkins as a defender of philosophy and the humanities more generally. Rik Peels argues that scientism is incoherent, since science ultimately rests on pre-scientific sources of knowledge such as perception and memory. One wonders again whether there can be anything controversial about this, though perhaps some might consider interesting whether perception, memory, and suchlike could be fully absorbed within a Quinean web of knowledge. Even Rosenberg has concerns that mathematics may lie outside the boundaries of science, though he proposes that a fictionalist interpretation of mathematics together with David Lewis's proposed reduction of numbers to classes might solve the problem. Many readers, I suspect, will wonder whether the defence of radical scientism justifies the deployment of such heavy machinery.

Why should we worry about scientism? One main concern is that some methodology, taken to be established as the universally right way to carry out scientific research, will be applied to areas where it is in fact quite inappropriate. The reaction of many philosophers of science to such projects is likely to be that there is no such thing as the correct methodology of science. The sciences are a very diverse set of epistemic practices that have developed in response to an equally diverse set of problems or subject matters. Scientism, then, is just a rather misleading name for the general error of applying methods that have been appropriate to one subject matter (or possibly none) to another to which they are not.

However, several contributors do have more substantive views about what science is that lead to more concrete concerns about the dangers of scientism. A substantive view of science implies what used to be much more commonly discussed under the rubric of a "demarcation criterion", the most famous, or notorious, being Popper's criterion of falsifiability. If there is a demarcation criterion it can be violated, and violations can constitute objectionable scientism. Massimo Pigliucci is keen to defend the importance of a demarcation criterion, and thereby to insist on the real risks of scientism. He also recognizes, however, that sciences are diverse and the criterion cannot be sharp. What he proposes is a broadly institutional criterion: "science is what scientists do" (p. 197). Science is a social activity involving such things as writing papers, carrying out experiments, submitting grant proposals, and suchlike. Though I am sympathetic to such an institutional account of science, it does raise a worry. It is easy enough to ape the methods and social practices of science. Probably some so-called pseudosciences (astrology, homeopathy, and the like) do so pretty well. But it is at least arguable that practices more widely taken to be sciences, complete with university departments, laboratories, peer reviewed journals and the rest, could lack the epistemic virtue we generally assign to the scientific. I, and others, have made such arguments about evolutionary psychology; Ross, in this volume, defends economics against similar attacks. In my view one of the most useful applications of the accusation of scientism is just to such practices that satisfy institutional criteria for science but lack some further normatively epistemological features.

Other contributors ground their understandings of scientism in more general theses about science. Thomas Nickles identifies scientism with various indefensibly strong forms of realism, views about the deep or final truth of scientific claims. Recognizing the historical ephemerality of most (or all) scientific theses should lead us to understand the merits of science in a way that doesn't depend on claims about their truth. Importantly, insistence on truth, Nickles argues, can become a significant obstacle to scientific progress, blocking serious consideration of radical ideas that contradict accepted "truth". So scientism, for Nickles, as well as promoting a lot of unwarranted hype, is an internal problem for science itself.

Michael Ruse makes a somewhat parallel argument on the basis of the widely acknowledged insistence that science is grounded in metaphors. Particular metaphors exploit particular similarities but inevitably conceal others. He considers in some detail the move during the Scientific Revolution from metaphors of the world as an organism to the world as machine. By the twentieth century the machine metaphor extended its application to organisms, and ideas such as that the human brain is a computer. Certain questions, Ruse argues (for example about morality, or the existence of anything rather than nothing) are inevitably excluded from science by this root metaphor. For me Ruse's argument would be more compelling if he were less unequivocal in his enthusiasm for the root metaphor: "as we move into and through the twentieth century the machine metaphor rides triumphant" (p.255). My own reading is that there is a good deal of well-grounded resistance to the machine metaphor within twentieth and twenty-first century science, and that without denying the importance of metaphors to science, the idea of an all-conquering root metaphor is misleading (even scientistic?).

To my mind the greatest threat from scientism at the present moment is from the widespread hostility to the humanities, and to a lesser degree the social sciences, from current neoliberal governments. A recent UK education minister (Robert Haflon) is quoted as saying that all university courses "should be about high-skilled employability". He added: "If someone wants to do medieval history that's fine . . . But all the incentives from government and so on should go to areas the country needs and will bring it most benefit." [1] The combination of this utilitarian attitude to education and research with the unargued assumption that utility lies overwhelmingly with the sciences has underpinned attacks on the humanities in the UK and many other countries for several decades. So I particularly welcome the robust defence of the humanities by Kitcher and also the more qualified defence by Blackford. The real message of the diversity of scientific practices and the consequent difficulty in finding any clear demarcation of science is that we should look critically but sympathetically at as wide as possible a range of knowledge-seeking practices. As several contributors to the volume demonstrate, some excellent ways of understanding the world and ourselves better lie outside the institutionally defined boundaries of science.

There are a number of essays in this collection that are well worth reading. However, recalling the worry with which I started this essay, I was not convinced in the end that the subject matter was sufficiently coherent to make a very satisfying collection. I think that the editors might have ameliorated this concern a little by imposing a little structure on the volume. But as it stands I found the whole rather less than the sum of its parts.

[1] Reported by Daniel Leal-Olivas, The Times, January 23, 2018.