Science v. Religion? Intelligent Design and the Problem of Evolution

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Steve Fuller, Science v. Religion? Intelligent Design and the Problem of Evolution, Polity Press, 2007, 179pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745641225.

Reviewed by Sahotra Sarkar, University of Texas at Austin


In the contemporary debate over creationism Steve Fuller is best known for his "expert" testimony at the 2005 Dover, Pennsylvania creationism trial during which he defended the teaching of Intelligent Design (ID) creationism in science classes in public high schools in the United States. Fuller argued that much of Western science has its roots in traditional ID and, therefore, modern ID creationism belongs in science curricula. According to Fuller neither ID's proponents, let alone its scientific critics, truly appreciate its significance for the development of science: modern science is supposed to be fundamentally based on the idea of Intelligent Design. Fuller apparently thinks that this historical claim has the normative implication that science should continue to embrace ID. The book under review is an elaboration of these arguments though it also traipses, somewhat unsteadily, into the legal territory that was demarcated by Judge Jones' resounding rejection of ID's claim to be anything other than religious dogma masquerading as science.

Fuller has a Ph.D. in the history and philosophy of science, but his appointment is in the sociology department at the University of Warwick; philosophers should presumably approach his work with an attempt at charity. This is not easy. The book consists of a largely content-free Introduction, five substantive chapters, and a Conclusion. The first, historical chapter tries to reinterpret the traditional religion-science dispute as one over social authority, between church and state. The second, "ideological" chapter attempts to show that modern science emerged from an attempt by humanity to transcend itself and reach god. The third chapter turns to complexity, the emphasis on which is supposed to distinguish ID from "other versions of creationism" (p. 69). (I will happily follow Fuller in explicitly construing ID as a form of creationism but I doubt that most ID proponents will be quite as accommodating on this point.) Strangely, the third chapter barely mentions the arguments about complexity pushed by prominent ID creationists such as Michael Behe and William Dembski. Rather, it ranges over a variety of extraneous issues, including the significance of Thomas Kuhn, the possibility that humans may be completing god's plan, the claim that complexity increases in the course of the history of science.

According to its title, the fourth chapter (which is by far the book's longest) turns to legal issues. This is perhaps the most interesting part of the book as Fuller analyzes his experience at the Dover trial. He raises one important point: philosophers of science, as expert witnesses at such trials, have often used flawed arguments. For instance, falsifiability or some other such strict demarcation criterion between science and non-science was wielded by philosophers such as Michael Ruse to argue that creationism is not science. These demarcation criteria are all controversial, and Larry Laudan (1982) and others (including me) have long urged philosophers not to resort to them. Nevertheless, Fuller accepts these criteria and argues that what constitutes scientific work should be determined by the methods used rather than what motivated it. According to him, Judge Jones incorrectly appealed to the motivation of scientific work to decide the Dover case against ID when he noted the religious motivations of the Dover school board as part of his reasoning. Here the Judge was clearly wrong and he has been equally strongly criticized for using the demarcation criteria that Fuller defends (Sarkar, forthcoming). Fuller goes on to claim (without argument) that not allowing creationism in science classes constitutes an institutionalization of atheism (p. 112). The chapter includes a discussion of supernaturalism which, Fuller contends, should be understood in continuity with naturalism. This contention is based on reinterpreting supernatural entities as those theoretical entities the existence of which must be inferred through difficult experiments.

The fifth chapter pontificates on the future of Darwinism. Fuller predicts that Darwinism (by which he means the entire framework of evolutionary theory) will be dead by the end of the twenty-first century and will be replaced by something more akin to ID creationism. No particular reason is given for this pious hope other than that Marxism underwent a similar denouement during the twentieth century (though, obviously it was not replaced by ID). As is quite common among creationists, Darwinism is also taken to task for having inspired nativism and Nazism. A desultory Conclusion begins by claiming that the book has shown that the dispute between science and religion is social and not conceptual. The end of this chapter simply reiterates Fuller's view that "both friends and foes of [ID creationism] are profoundly ignorant of the centrality of intelligent design to the rise of modern science" (p. 162).

Let me now turn from description to commentary. Fuller's analysis of the intellectual disputes over contemporary ID creationism is almost vacuous. The chapter on complexity does not even broach the many fairly sophisticated responses and rebuttals spurred by Behe's and Dembski's arguments (see Sarkar [2007] and Sober [2008] for an entry into this literature). It is less than clear that Fuller has deigned to familiarize himself with the intellectual terrain in which Behe and Dembski operate, let alone the arguments of their critics. ID creationists would serve themselves better by engaging a more competent defender. For readers seeking an introduction to the technical issues surrounding contemporary creationism, this book is useless.

Moreover, as noted earlier, Fuller's account of the Dover trial is unreliable. Similarly, the discussion of naturalism and supernaturalism is less than compelling. If supernatural entities are nothing other than theoretical entities that are the most remote from experiment (however this is measured), the supernatural still falls under the purview of natural law. There are no miracles, no room for divine intervention, not even space for the deity to jumpstart processes such as the Cambrian "explosion", which ID creationists take to be one of the major occasions when the deity fueled information into the progress of life on Earth. Fuller's is not a sense of "supernatural" that would excite real creationists or inflame any of their critics. As with the discussion of complexity, Fuller fails to engage the interesting debate over naturalism that ID creationism has generated. Just as the third chapter demonstrated Fuller's lack of familiarity with the work of Behe and Dembski, the remarks on supernaturalism shows him to be equally non-cognizant of the work of the third member of ID creationism's intellectual triumvirate, Philip Johnson.

If there is any positive contribution that this book makes, it will have to be because of the historical perspective it brings to the science-religion dispute. But this is where the book has even less to offer. Much of the first two chapters consists of a tendentious presentation of well-worn history: that many scientists, especially before Darwin, saw themselves as deciphering divine purpose in the universe, that there was a connection between monotheistic religion and the pursuit of a unified conception of nature (as famously argued by Ray Williams), and so on. Throughout the book Fuller takes great pains to emphasize the uncontroversial point that science and religion have on occasion shared goals in the past. But this fact does not establish the claim that intelligent design was central to the rise of science except to the trivial extent that the worshipped deity was typically supposed to be intelligent. Moreover, even if ID was once central to science, it does not follow either (i) that science has not since moved beyond that stage or (ii) that it should not now maintain a healthy distance from ID. (Think of an analogy: it is easy to argue that determinism was crucial to the rise of physics. Does that imply that physics still clings -- or should cling -- to determinism even after the rise of quantum mechanics?) Ultimately, the claim that Fuller wants to defend is a normative one: that science should re-embrace ID. But this normative claim does not follow from the descriptive claim that science once embraced ID (leaving aside the question whether the descriptive claim is true). Some further argument is necessary and Fuller offers none.

Beyond that, Fuller's interpretation of the history of philosophy is often idiosyncratic: the existence of Kant's "transcendental" realm is reduced to the claim that "our humanity depends less on God's existence than our assumption that God exists" (p. 56). Logical positivists, and not just Popper, are supposed to have labeled Darwinism a "metaphysical research program" (p. 133). I am not aware of a single logical positivist (or logical empiricist) text that supports this claim. Given that for the logical positivists (in contrast to Popper) "metaphysical" was a term of opprobrium, it is unlikely that any of them would have embraced this formulation. The logical positivists may well have believed physics to be of more fundamental importance than biology, but the latter science nevertheless belonged to the pantheon. The foundations of biology were intended to be part of their Encyclopedia of Unified Science.

The idea that a difference should make a difference is attributed to Gregory Bateson in 1979 (p. 62) even though (as Bateson explicitly acknowledged) its source is in the work of William James several decades earlier. Most importantly, Fuller does not even address the question whether the development of evolutionary theory, and its naturalistic explanation of adaptation (through blind variation and natural selection), made it possible for the first time to have a non-teleological account of the world. Did Darwin and Wallace achieve something special? On Fuller's account, they apparently did not.

Fuller's grasp of history of science, and of the sciences themselves, turns out to be equally interesting. A few examples will be worthwhile. Newton is supposed to have "presented his mathematical physics as the divine plan that was implicitly written into the Bible [emphasis added]" (p. 54). Fuller must have access to an otherwise unknown veridical edition of the Principia. In the early nineteenth century, Cuvier and Agassiz were supposed to have been thinking of climate change (p. 59). Around the same time, Lamarck is supposed to have held that "lower organisms literally strove to become higher organisms, specifically humans, who at some point in the future would be Earth's sole denizens" (p. 146), a view to be found nowhere in the Lamarckian corpus.

The "Darwinian doctrine" is supposed to consist of the belief that "chance mutations are the driving force of evolution" (p. 31). One wonders what happened to natural selection. Fuller has an answer: "compounded historical accidents" are also known as "natural selection" (p. 48). This issue is particularly troubling because what separates the neutral model of evolution from the selectionist or "Darwinian" model of evolution is the question whether chance mutations drive evolution: the neutralists claim they do whereas the selectionists argue for the primacy of natural selection. For some mysterious reason, Fuller has reversed the selectionists' position.

Returning to Fuller's book, Mendel is supposed to have had his work rejected by scientific experts before he published it in a local journal in Brünn (p. 61), a rejection of which no other historian is aware. Pearson and Galton's biometry is supposed to have been based on a "blending theory of inheritance" (p. 145) even though Pearson explicitly denied assuming any theory at all and Galton reported experiments to refute the blending theory. William Jennings Bryan is supposed to have been an "expert witness for the prosecution" (p. 115) in the Scopes trial, rather than what he was: the prosecutor who famously agreed to be an expert witness for the defense. Thanks to molecular biology, genes are supposed to have been "[broken] down into ordered strings of amino acids" (p. 135); one wonders what happened to DNA nucleotide bases. All microevolution is supposed to have been designed by humans (p. 141); presumably ancient humans were privy to enough biological warfare techniques to design malaria and cause the spread of the sickle cell allele in tropical and subtropical populations.

The modern theory of evolution is often interpreted to be a synthesis in the 1930s of Mendel's theory of inheritance with Darwin's theory of natural selection (along with natural history). But, for Fuller, it was a synthesis "between molecular genetics and natural history" and it is supposed to have happened a decade before 1955 (p. 58) even though there was no possibility of a molecular genetics before the Watson-Crick double helix model of DNA which, incidentally, appeared in 1953. (Elsewhere in the book he accepts the standard interpretation of the synthesis [e.g., p. 134].) These excursions into fancy allow me to end on a positive note: the lack of depth or insight in this book is more than compensated by the entertainment it provides, at least to a philosopher or historian of science. No one should begrudge us our simple pleasures. I'm happy to have read this book, and even more so not to have paid for it.


Laudan, L. 1982. "Science at the Bar: Causes for Concern." Science, Technology and Human Values 7: 16 -19.

Sarkar, S. 2007. Doubting Darwin? Creationist Designs on Evolution. Oxford, UK: Blackwell.

Sarkar, S. Forthcoming. "The Science Question in Intelligent Design." Synthese, in press.

Sober, E. 2008. Evidence and Evolution: The Logic Behind the Science. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.