Scientific Enquiry and Natural Kinds: From Planets to Mallards

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P. D. Magnus, Scientific Enquiry and Natural Kinds: From Planets to Mallards, Palgrave Macmillan, 2012, 222pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230369177.

Reviewed by Matthew H. Slater, Bucknell University


Over the past several decades, we've seen a variety of philosophical approaches to natural kinds. The influential work of Kripke and Putnam began with general questions about reference. How (and to what) do certain general terms like 'water', 'gold', 'elm', and 'lemon' refer? Other approaches assumed a "metaphysics-first" orientation and focused on the referents of these terms -- the natural kinds themselves -- and inquired after their connections to natural laws, properties, and dispositions (rather than the manner in which the terms describing them are introduced, survive theory change, and so on).

Advocates of both approaches generally aimed to vindicate the thesis that natural kinds are important pivots in scientific enquiry -- but often with disappointing results. Early essentialists bungled the science, while their later followers were overly willing to bite the bullet and deny that there were natural kinds outside of the essentialists' stronghold of physics and chemistry. Anti-essentialists, rallying around Boyd's Homeostatic Property Cluster (HPC) account of kinds, placed more emphasis on the role that natural kinds played in affording inductive and explanatory success in science. But though the HPC account is now regarded by many as a more expansive, flexible, and scientifically-informed approach to natural kinds, it has faced some stiff conceptual and practical challenges (to its application to species taxa, among other things).

A common thread running through all of these approaches, however -- whether they start with language or the metaphysics of laws and properties, whether they individuate natural kinds via essences or homeostatic property clusters -- is the tendency for mismatch between the categories scientific theories take seriously and the categories vindicated as "natural" by the accounts. Whether such mismatch is reckoned a problem or a result depends on one's outlook. Does taking scientific practice seriously require that all scientific categories (meeting certain qualifications, perhaps) be so vindicated?

In his book, P. D. Magnus avoids the mismatch between scientifically significant categories and natural kinds by articulating an account of natural kinds that starts with the categories that figure in scientific enquiry. It's a difficult task to offer an account of a highly contested philosophical concept that is at once utterly novel and deserves to be taken seriously, but I think Magnus has done this. Is his account successful? Ultimately, I am not persuaded -- and I suspect others will balk too -- but I have certainly profited by grappling with his approach.

Chapter 1 begins with a short historical survey of philosophical thinking about natural kinds that culminates in separate discussions of eleven theses commonly assumed about natural kinds (8) -- e.g., that natural kinds support inductive inferences, have essences, are tied to natural laws, must have sharp boundaries, must be individuated by intrinsic properties, and so on -- only three of which survive scrutiny (45). These are "the induction assumption", the assumption that "natural kinds are the appropriate categories for scientific enquiry", and the thesis that "a kind is natural for an enquiry, rather than natural simpliciter" (8). Discussions of these theses, while in some cases shorter than I'd have preferred, were refreshingly substantive for coming in a first chapter; Magnus is eager to lay his cards on the table. And they helped motivate some of the important features of his own account of natural kinds.

In Chapter 2 Magnus presents this account. In brief, natural kinds are those categories that "scientists are forced to posit in order to be scientifically successful in their domain of enquiry" (47). Notice how Magnus builds the domain-relativity of natural kinds into the ground-level of the account. The official (strict) characterization runs:

A category k is a natural kind for domain d if (1) k is part of a taxonomy that allows the scientific enquiry into d to achieve inductive and explanatory success, and (2) any alternative taxonomy that excluded k would not do so. (48)

(Since Magnus clearly intends this account as constituting a constraint on what should count as a natural kind, I presume that the 'if' above is supposed to be an 'if and only if'.) (1) represents what Magnus refers to as a "success clause"; (2) represents a "restriction clause". The rest of Chapter 2 gives some nuance to the above definition by weakening the restriction clause, acknowledging that "success has different aspects" (50). It also connects these issues to familiar conundrums in the general philosophy of science, and begins addressing some of the questions his account is apt to generate. Magnus starts putting the account to work in Chapter 3 by asking whether planets are natural kinds for astronomy and whether species (either species taxa or the species category itself) are natural kinds for biology.

Chapter 4 returns to more abstract philosophical questions about whether an account with such close ties to scientific practice can rightly be regarded as realist. The answer is not straightforward. Magnus characterizes his approach as representing a "pragmatic naturalism" but argues that this is compatible with a view he calls "equity realism", which appears to be a kind of scientific realism. As the name suggests (in this context), equity realism assumes an egalitarian posture toward "the posits of science, insisting only that electrons are on much the same footing as pain and baguettes" (119; pun intended?). And since, on Magnus's view, the posits of science include natural kinds such as electron (Magnus sets in boldface category words which represent natural kinds for a given domain), it follows that "Electron as a natural kind for physics and chemistry is on the same footing as electrons [that is, individual, concrete electrons]" (120). Natural kinds are thus as real as baguettes.

Remarkably, chapter 5 continues the thread of baking examples. The subtitle of Magnus's book -- 'From Planets to Mallards' -- understates the scope of his treatment (and acceptance) of natural kinds. 'From Muffins to Meerkat Yelps' would be equally apt given his tentative acceptance of the possibility of natural kinds of baked goods (in which TV nerd -- chef hero Alton Brown figures prominently, 133-6) followed immediately by an argument that meerkat aerial alarm is a natural kind "for enquiry concerning meerkats in their natural environment" (139). Chapter 6 addresses the relation of Magnus's account to what he clearly sees as his closest competitor -- the HPC account -- and includes a useful discussion of one of the more thorny problems for the HPC's application to biological species: the polymorphism problem. (This is where the subtitle's mallards enter the picture.) Solving this problem requires "getting over" what Magnus calls "similarity fetishism" (156) -- a component of one of the rejected theses from Chapter 1 -- and tinkering with some of the details of the HPC account. The upshot, however, is that it's possible to make sense of species taxa as HPC natural kinds while retaining Magnus's general picture of natural kinds. Rather than seeing HPC a competing account of natural kinds, HPC concepts are simply assimilated into Magnus's account: "This is the value," he writes, "of discussing HPCs after we have the account of natural kinds in place: Many natural kinds are HPCs, and we can understand them better by recognizing this" (147). It's clear, however, that the general account must take precedence -- HPC theory cannot be regarded as anything but an explanation for why some categories are indispensable to certain scientific pursuits, lest Magnus be forced to acknowledge some sort of pre-established theoretical harmony between the world and our categories.

Packed, as it is, with challenging arguments and fascinating case studies, I cannot possibly do justice to the breadth of Magnus's views in this context. While I'm sympathetic to many of these views, I found much along the way to dispute. That's to the good. In the remainder of this review, however, I would like to register some concerns about Magnus's core proposal.

Let's begin by considering the two clauses of the definition in turn. The success clause, recall, requires that a kind k be part of a taxonomy that allows the scientific enquiry into domain d to achieve inductive and explanatory success. How we should understand such success does not, however, get much discussion beyond noting the different ways in which it might be evaluated (inductive/predictive, explanatory, manipulative). Magnus appears to see this underspecification as a theoretical advantage: "Where the details of success matter, the account of natural kinds is compatible with different ways of filling the lacuna" (48). Nor does Magnus tell us much about how to understand 'allows' in the success clause. Depending on how broadly one construes 'inductive and explanatory success' for a given domain, it seems likely that there would be some "pseudo-kinds" (my phrase: i.e., obviously gerrymandered or otherwise pathologically non-natural categories) inert enough to not stand in the way of the success that their parent domain achieves (despite their being clearly "non-natural"). One phenomenon can allow another without at the same time contributing to it in any a positive way.

Rather than attempt to find a more active substitute for 'allow' in the success clause (e.g., 'facilitate'? 'enable'?), I suspect that Magnus wants to leave it to the restriction clause to capture the sense that k not only allows for, but contributes to the domain's success. At first glance, the restriction clause (as written) is ambiguous: that "any alternative taxonomy that excluded k would not do so" (48; my emphasis). In the context of the success clause, this would suggest the reading: 'any alternative taxonomy that excluded k would not allow for the scientific enquiry into d to achieve inductive and explanatory success'. This is clearly too strong; it would apparently foreclose the possibility of gradual development of enquiry into a particular domain. But surely we've seen sciences that have achieved impressive success (on anyone's measure) without identifying each of the categories that would later figure in that science's success.

Magnus acknowledges the "remarkable" strictness of the restriction clause (49) and offers various ways of weakening it. But this is a tricky business. The point he is trying to get at, he says, is "that the world condemns a great many taxonomies to failure. Constraint from the world is what makes identifying natural kinds the discovery of structure in the world, rather than merely the imposition of a set of labels onto things that are undifferentiated in nature" (50). He allows that worldly constraint also comes in degrees. Kinds should be regarded as natural "to the degree that the world penalizes enquiry conducted using taxonomies that do not acknowledge the kind" (50). This suggests an obvious alternative reading of the restriction clause: rather than regarding natural kinds (for a domain) as categories that are indispensible simpliciter (the categories that scientists are forced to posit if they are to see any inductive and explanatory success), make this "indispensability" a matter of degree. For example, we might say that a kind is natural for a domain to the extent that enquiry in that domain would not be as successful in its predictions and explanations.

The trouble with this interpretation, however, is that in order to apply it, we must apparently evaluate the truth of counterfactuals involving alternative ways of doing science and then carry out potentially fine-grained comparisons of their relative success. In other words, we must ask whether a given science would have been just as successful (or less) had it not included a certain kind k. To the degree that it wouldn't be just as successful, k is a natural kind for that domain. Now, granted: in some cases, e.g., let k be electrons, the answer seems clear enough. But in cases where the kind serves in less of a paradigm-defining role (but still appears to be a genuinely natural kind), I'm not sure how I should suss out an answer to this question. This seems a fraught business for many reasons. For one, sciences often set the terms of their success by the questions they ask. Conceivably, the identification of a certain category might open up questions that would not have arisen otherwise and which end up stymying the discipline (one might think of this as a sort of dual to a Kuhnian loss). Is it more or less successful than it would have been otherwise? My intuitions go blank here.

Your mileage may vary, however -- particularly when it comes to seeing the account worked out in the context of Magnus's case studies. For my part, I found these discussions interesting but not uniformly convincing (though as someone with particular views in this area, I may be a tough sell). In a sense, one of the key selling points of Magnus's book -- the dizzying breadth of examples he considers -- leads to one of the book's downsides: the brevity of these discussions. I also wanted more discussion of the way in which he proposed to vindicate his account's realist credentials. Equity realism holds electron to be as real as a baguette, but short of seeing the existence of this baguette sitting on the plate as somehow domain-relative, it's hard to see how this could be right. The main argument for seeing his account as realist seems to turn on the assumption that "success is only possible [when] the world will sustain it" (118), which allows him to claim that while "Whether we discover natural kinds depends both on the domain and on our ingenuity, . . . whether they are there does not depend on us" (119). I have doubts about both the pivotal assumption and whether, if true, it could marry the domain-relativity Magnus builds into his account with equity realism.

Whether or not Magnus's full account withstands scrutiny with all of its many features intact (these brief remarks are only the start of a longer conversation), he has certainly done philosophers of science a favor by blazing a new and fascinating trail into territory that I hope and expect will be explored by others. Whether the book belongs in an undergraduate philosophy of science course, I'm somewhat less certain. On the one hand, Magnus is careful to connect many points of his discussion to traditional topics and questions in metaphysics and the philosophy of science (including the new riddle of induction, the Duhem-Quine problem, underdetermination, the no-miracles argument, the problem of the many, universals, and so on), offering short explications of these issues in the process. Depending on how one incorporated the text into the course, this could work very well indeed. On the other hand, it occasionally seemed as though Magnus saw other professional philosophers of science as the book's primary audience. Putnam's Twin Earth thought experiment is described as "notorious", scientific realism is introduced without much explanation as "a specter", and clever neologisms and inside philosophical jokes are generously sprinkled throughout: "The veldt extends beyond [his] umwelt", Magnus reports (111). These sorts of quips -- and there are many -- will almost certainly leave students scratching their heads. For instructors (and students) prepared to deal with this, however, I think the wide range of examples Magnus deals with, the way in which he connects them to other general issues, and the opportunities the book offers for productive discussion make it a worthy supplement to an advanced course in the philosophy of science and well-worth reading by professionals working in or around the subject of scientific classification.


Thanks to P. D. Magnus for offering comments on an earlier draft of this review; any remaining mistakes or misinterpretations are, of course, my own.