Scientific Metaphysics

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Don Ross, James Ladyman, and Harold Kincaid (eds.), Scientific Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2013, 243pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199696499.

Reviewed by Richard Healey, University of Arizona


The current efflorescence of what goes by the name of analytic metaphysics is regarded with deep suspicion by many naturalistically inclined philosophers. James Ladyman and Don Ross gave voice to this suspicion in the first chapter of their iconoclastic Every Thing Must Go (Oxford, 2007) before developing a naturalistic alternative in the rest of the book. In November 2009, the University of Alabama hosted a conference entitled "Does scientific naturalism exclude metaphysics?" that brought together a number of prominent philosophers sympathetic to the idea of a naturalized metaphysics to discuss what that might amount to. That was the origin of this collection of essays, though rewriting and additions make the book more than just the proceedings of that conference.

Readers (and future historians of philosophy) may find it interesting to compare these essays with those appearing in Chalmers, Manley and Wasserman's Metametaphysics (Oxford, 2009), another collection of essays spawned by conferences in which philosophers met to ponder the nature and future of metaphysics and ontology. A comparison of indexes is revealing. Names of scientists and mathematicians indexed: over 40 in Scientific Metaphysics, 0 in Metametaphysics; references related to quantifiers: 32 in the index to Metametaphysics, 0 in the index to Scientific Metaphysics; index entries related to quantum physics: more than 56 in Scientific Metaphysics, 0 in Metametaphysics; index entries related to mereology: 32 in Metametaphysics, 0 in Scientific Metaphysics. Yet fundamental ontology is supposedly a major topic of both volumes. Whatever naturalized metaphysics comes to, it is clearly less enamored with logical analysis of language but pays much closer attention to actual science than a lot of what goes by the name of analytic metaphysics.

But does naturalized metaphysics come to anything, or should naturalist philosophers forswear metaphysics altogether, along with their positivist predecessors and empiricist and pragmatist contemporaries like Bas van Fraassen and Huw Price? While generally sympathetic to the idea that metaphysics is inseparable from science, the contributors to Scientific Metaphysics answer this question differently, depending on how each understands the goals and methods of metaphysics. Every Thing Must Go was a rallying call to confine metaphysics to a particular kind of radically naturalistic metaphysics (naturalistic metaphysicsETMG ), which Andrew Melnyk here subjects to constructive criticism.

Naturalistic metaphysicsETMG attempts to unify hypotheses and theories taken seriously by contemporary science. Moreover, these are to include at least one specific hypothesis drawn from fundamental physics, but no hypothesis that current science declares beyond our capacity to investigate should be taken seriously. The naturalistic metaphysicianETMG will consider few traditional metaphysical topics worth his time, while contemporary analytic metaphysicians are unlikely to divert their energies to a project of unifying science. Melnyk argues that naturalistic metaphysicsETMG is too narrow, but is cautiously optimistic about the prospects of a suitably expanded naturalized metaphysics. His optimism is based on his view that there are questions we would like to answer that don't fall within the province of the sciences, including (but not limited to) the question of how to unify the sciences. His caution arises from a methodological concern: since a priori methods are unlikely to help us answer such questions, we would need to resort to empirical methods -- but how could that go?

Anjan Chakravartty has a very different take on naturalized metaphysics. As a naturalist, he wishes to take science seriously as his starting point. The problem, then, is why and how to go on. A number of metaphysical questions seem to arise when one reflects on science: What is a law of nature? Are space and time real? What, if anything, are causation, dispositions, powers, probability? These form the subject matter of what has been called the metaphysics of science. But why are these not simply scientific questions, as some have taken them to be?

Chakravartty is tempted by the thought that what distinguishes metaphysics from science here is its a priori method. He acknowledges this could distinguish metaphysics from science only if science itself were a purely empirical enterprise with no a priori component -- a view he rejects. A natural alternative would be to base a naturalized metaphysics on just the empirical content of science. Chakravartty argues that this alternative requires substantive clarification of the basing relation if it is not to count as naturalistic any piece of a priori metaphysical theorizing prompted by observation. He proposes to clarify the relation by saying in just what sense(s) naturalistic metaphysics must be continuously connected to the empirical content of science. Chakravartty is optimistic that the resulting naturalistic metaphysics may contribute to our knowledge of the world. But it seems unlikely to satisfy a naturalistic metaphysicianETMG, resting as it does on the same vague criteria of coherence and simplicity, disputable intuitions and loose application of inference to the best explanation that characterize non-naturalized metaphysics.

In their essays, Paul Humphreys and Daniel Dennett both address the question of what things there are in the world. There is an apparent irony, given Every Thing Must Go's argument that there are no fundamental things! But no one would want to call the things Dennett finds in our manifest image of the world fundamental -- things like sakes, dints, miles, holes, voices, dollars, centers of gravity, words and apps. An analytic metaphysician might dismiss Dennett's typology of things as merely another instance of his renowned philosophical humor. But that would be to miss Dennett's deep pragmatist point -- that it is more important to appreciate the purposes for which we agents created concepts of these things than to undertake the quixotic and ultimately unrevealing task of relating them in an orderly way to some allegedly fundamental ontology.

Humphreys inveighs against the kind of ontological investigation at issue in Metametaphysics -- an investigation that would produce an ontology largely uninformed and unmotivated by science. He contrasts this speculative ontology unfavorably with the ontology of a scientific metaphysics that would employ superior methods and sets out to describe and recommend those methods. Four complaints ground his deep suspicion of the pretensions of speculative ontology: its widespread factual falsity, appeal to intuitions, informal use of conceptual analysis and assumption of scale invariance. This fourth complaint is noteworthy. An important lesson of twentieth century science is that the world appears and behaves very differently at length, time and energy scales inaccessible to ordinary human experience. Speculative ontology ignores this lesson at its peril when extrapolating concepts and intuitions beyond the familiar human scale. Humphreys still finds a place for a scientifically informed metaphysics in addressing ontological questions raised but not answered by science: for example, how could a deterministically evolving universe's initial state contain all the information required to specify its entire future development? But he has little to offer by way of guidance in how to address such questions beyond the advice to follow specific methods that have proved reliable in science itself.

In their essay, James Ladyman and Don Ross present a significant new application of naturalistic metaphysicsETMG. What inspired this application was David Deutsch's recent The Beginning of Infinity (Viking Penguin, 2011), a work of naturalistic metaphysics by a physicist rather than a professional philosopher. Given their self-professed scientism, Ladyman and Ross welcome thoughtful scientists to the fold of naturalistic metaphysiciansETMG, and in this essay they try to reach out beyond narrowly philosophical readers of Every Thing Must Go to the wider scientific community. But while endorsing Deutsch's optimism about the Enlightenment project of comprehending the world through scientific reason, they detect and seek to correct a residual non-naturalism in his metaphysics.

Deutsch made seminal early contributions to quantum computation, and has since become a prominent advocate of what others call an Everettian or many worlds interpretation of quantum theory (though he, along with the philosopher David Wallace, takes himself to be simply spelling out the implications of quantum theory itself). The Beginning of Infinity looks like a paradigm of naturalistic metaphysicsETMG. Deutsch offers a synoptic vision of computation theory, evolution, information, and cognition, all in a fundamentally quantum world. Ladyman and Ross rightly point out naiveties in Deutsch's philosophy of science, largely due to his uncritical Popperianism. But their main objection is directed at one of Deutsch's reasons for favoring Everettian quantum theory.

It may surprise some analytic metaphysicians to learn that each of two prominent realist approaches (Bohmian and Everettian) portrays the quantum world as fundamentally deterministic. For Deutsch, explanation is what drives science, and indeed all human cognition -- he even offers a persuasive definition of a person as an entity that can create explanatory knowledge! Perhaps a deterministic theory would provide a more complete and satisfying explanation than an indeterministic theory. Deutsch considers that one important reason to adopt Everettian quantum theory in preference to, say, Bohr's Copenhagen interpretation, which views quantum theory as indeterministic.

Ladyman and Ross chide Deutsch for slipping into bad old non-naturalized metaphysics here by appealing to an illegitimate inference to the best explanation -- i.e., one that would make the world safe for "our" (Newtonian? Kantian?) intuitions. Rejecting any such inference, they favor a view of quantum theory that sticks closer to the statistical data that provides its evidence base. Every Thing Must Go argued for an ontology of structure, not of things with intrinsic properties. Its slogan was: to be real is to be a real pattern. While Deutsch (and other realists) take the quantum state to be both real and fundamental, Ladyman and Ross locate fundamental reality in the stochastic patterns it predicts and helps us understand. The world is the totality of non-redundant statistics, not of things. Quantum theory deals with such statistics at the most fundamental level.

This is an interesting proposal, and I agree that quantum states are no novel addition to scientific ontology (see my "Quantum theory: a pragmatist approach", Brit. J. Phil. Sci. 63, (2012), 729-771). But it is not only analytic metaphysicians who will reject their proposal. A statistical regularity can be no more fundamental than its instances, but how can we conceive of each fundamental instance except as some thing(s) bearing some properties or relations?

Naturalized metaphysics is never explicitly discussed in the exchange between Mark Wilson and Michael Friedman. Their exchange began in a symposium on Wilson's Wandering Significance (Oxford, 2006) in Nous (2010, Vol. 44 Issue 3): Wilson's first contribution to Scientific Metaphysics is a slightly altered version of the reply he offered to Friedman in that volume. Friedman here continues the exchange, and Wilson concludes (for now) with some remarks on how 'naturalism' with respect to scientific entities may profitably be pursued.

Wilson and Friedman agree that many of the characteristic problems and methods of analytic philosophy emerged early in the twentieth century as scientists as well as philosophers tried to come to grips with radical conceptual innovations accompanying recent developments in physics and mathematics. Wilson sees these as undermining a classical theory of concepts still present in Russell's work, while Friedman locates his own neo-Kantian defense of scientific objectivity against the threat posed by alleged Kuhnian incommensurability in the same tradition that spawned logical positivism.

Wilson views concept development as a piecemeal and contextual process fueled by diverse applications of a theory's mathematics. Friedman also rejects Quinean holism, but maintains that certain constitutive principles acquire a priori status relative to a theory such as relativity by implicitly defining key concepts required to apply the theory at all. Friedman seeks to reconcile their approaches, viewing them as complementary. But Wilson is reluctant to abandon a realist understanding of scientific objectivity as requiring some substantial theory-world correlation.

Despite their differences, I see both Wilson and Friedman as contributing to a kind of naturalized metaphysics. The concepts with which they are concerned are our best guide to scientific ontology because they have been forged in the fire of scientific practice. If metaphysics is concerned with the basic structure of reality, then there is no better place to look for a revealing description or representation of that structure.

In the final paper, Jenann Ismael explores the implications of a scientifically transformed concept of causation for the metaphysical problem of free will: How can my action be freely chosen if it is merely the outcome of a law-governed process proceeding from external physical causes? Recent work by scientists and philosophers including Judea Pearl, Clark Glymour and James Woodward has given us a new way of thinking of causal structure by tracing the implications of a hypothetical intervention in a network of regular probabilistic dependencies. In this framework information about causal structure is not given by laws characterizing these dependencies  -- so it may (indeed must) be consistently added to permit a causal characterization of the processes involved. She argues that this framework permits us to think of free action as such an intervention. Rather than conflicting with a causal account of the processes leading up to the action, it is the kind of thing that permits us to think of them as causal.

Causation presents an interesting test case for naturalistic metaphysics. The problems it raises are not merely ontological, and its intimate connection with ascriptions of moral and legal responsibility firmly anchors it in the domain of ordinary human interactions. Science may craft concepts of causation for its own purposes, but these do not encompass all our interests.

If this collection leaves it unclear just what naturalized metaphysics comes to, its advocates are at least making a serious attempt to engage with our pre-eminent knowledge-producing disciplines. Newton famously compared his efforts to those of a boy on the seashore who succeeded in picking up a smoother pebble or a prettier shell while the great ocean of truth lay all undiscovered before him. While naturalist metaphysicians are at sea trying to oversee the reconstruction of Neurath's boat, many a contemporary analytic metaphysician remains on the beach embellishing his or her own sand castle, oblivious to the incoming tide.