Scientific Pluralism

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Stephen H. Kellert, Helen E. Longino, and C. Kenneth Waters (eds.), Scientific Pluralism, University of Minnesota Press, 2006, 272pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780816647637.

Reviewed by David L. Hull, Northwestern University


In 1961 soon after I enrolled in the Department of History and Logic of Science at Indiana University, Ernst Nagel's The Structure of Science (1961) appeared. This was the first "philosophical" treatise that I had ever read -- and read and re-read. Which of the philosophical positions that Nagel set out should I accept? At least one of them had to be better than all the others. But by the time I had come to understand Nagel's book with sufficient sophistication, I could not tell these positions apart, let alone decide which were right. Such views as realism, nominalism, conceptualism, etc., all seemed the same to me -- once they were made sufficiently sophisticated.

As I read the articles in Scientific Pluralism (2006), I was struck by much the same impression. The editors of this anthology note that, "just as modest pluralisms are difficult to distinguish from a sophisticated form of monism, promiscuous realism is hard to distinguish from radical relativism" (xiii). They acknowledge that none of them holds precisely the same views as any of the others, whether they find themselves near one end of the pluralism-monism spectrum or the other. How pluralism and monism are understood "varies from thinker to thinker and topic to topic" (vii).

In this respect the distinction between pluralism and monism is not in the least unusual. We freely refer to "Darwinists" and "Darwinism" even though no two Darwinians ever seem to have held the same views. The authors in this anthology are very careful in their use of terminology, but because the issues are so complex and interconnected, so are theirs analyses. Perhaps I am over-reacting, but it seems to me as if no two advocates of pluralism mean the same thing by "pluralism." And this variation is not totally innocent. One of the most effective arguments against Darwin's theory of evolution was that Darwin thought that natural selection was the sole cause in biological evolution, but he never made such a claim. Natural selection is only the most important mechanism that drives evolution.

Advocates of pluralism present a similar ploy when it comes to Developmental Systems Theory. DST cannot be integrated into traditional versions of evolutionary theory. Instead it will replace them. Alan Richardson tells us in his contribution to the volume that when he started to study the unity of science movement, he thought that he had a reasonably good understanding of the movement. That is, until he delved more deeply into its history and discovered a "greater flexibility in the older ideas than we appreciated in mid- to late twentieth-century philosophy of science" (vii). The members of the Vienna Circle were not quite as obtuse as we thought that they were. Similarly, Neo-Darwinists are also not quite as impoverished as advocates of DST portray them as being.

Esther-Mirjam Sent points out that another feature of the dispute between pluralism and monism is that pluralism is a "reflexive doctrine" (p. 81). According to pluralists, there is one and only one preferable view with respect to the pluralism-monism controversy, and that view is pluralism. Pluralists are monistic with respect to pluralism. A parallel problem confronts monists. They are monists with respect to monism. What is the one true view of the philosophical debate over pluralism and monism? Monism, that's what, a position that seems somewhat circular.

This argument can be replayed at a variety of levels -- from science and the philosophy of science to meta-philosophy. The editors of this anthology ask whether or not consistency requires scientific pluralists to be pluralists in dealing with such philosophical concepts as theory, explanation, cause and probability. They answer, "We think it does" (xxvi).

I myself am partial to self-reflexive arguments. "All universal claims are false. This claim is universal. Hence, it is false." Such arguments can force you to re-examine your own positions and possibly even change them. In his contribution Kellert emphasizes a pluralistic approach within science studies -- not science but science studies. However, "pluralism about disciplinary approaches rejects any presumption that the synoptic view is exclusively correct" (p. 219).

The issue then becomes the criteria that are to be used to decide between monism and pluralism with respect to science as well as meta-philosophy and everything in between. Most striking is the reliance of these authors on case studies. "Our general thesis is epistemological: the only way to determine whether a part of the world will require a plurality of accounts is to examine the empirical results of scientific research of that part of the world" (xxiii).

The authors in this anthology not only argue for a pluralist stance but also for taking the naturalist turn (see Callebaut 1993). In fact, in this volume naturalism receives almost as much attention as pluralism does. Naturalism is also confronted with some long-standing problems of its own. Traditionally, philosophers have maintained that any claim for which empirical evidence is relevant cannot be genuinely "philosophical." On this view one goal of philosophy is to eliminate empirical content from philosophy, as much as possible. Bringing evidence to bear on empirical claims is difficult enough. Bringing it to bear on philosophical claims is even more difficult. Advocates of naturalism argue that the choice between naturalism and anti-naturalism can be resolved only by reference to evidence. As they see it, pluralism is true -- "contingently true" (pp. 81, 128, 228).

If philosophical positions are to be evaluated on the basis of scientific evidence, then the case studies used must be set out in great detail (xxii-xxiii). They cannot be mere illustrations. Four of the papers included in this volume are presented in sufficient detail to be used as evidence for and against pluralism; e.g., Ron Giere on color vision, Michael Dickson on quantum dynamics, Esther-Mirjam Sent on economics as well as Geoffrey Hellman and John L. Bell on mathematics. Two authors also present scientific data to support their views, but their case studies are somewhat less detailed and demanding; i.e., Helen E. Longino on the scientific study of behavior as well as Carla Fehr on the evolution of sex. Other authors simply deal with the pluralism-monism controversy in general; e.g., Alan W. Richardson, Wade Savage, Kenneth Waters and Stephen Kellert.

The authors in this anthology cover just about all bases with respect to pluralism versus monism, but two need a bit more attention. One of the strongest observations that bears on this dispute is precisely how extensive scientific theories, approaches, movements, projects and the like actually are. If they are extensive, then pluralism gains some support. If not, then not. From reading the philosophical literature on the subject, one would assume that genuine alternatives are commonplace. On the basis of the two areas of science that I understand well enough to venture an opinion (evolutionary theory and systematics), I would disagree.

Such things as respectable alternative theories are very hard to come by. Of course, if one allows nonsense alternatives into one's classification, then they are extensive, but scientists have the good sense to limit themselves to serious alternatives; for example, Fehr (p. 167) notes that, since Darwin, biologists have come up with over twenty explanations for sex. To her that seems a lot. But she herself investigates only three of these explanations -- the Red Queen hypothesis, Muller's ratchet and DNA repair. Are three examples enough?

Scientists tend to be monists, especially with respect to their own favorite hypotheses, while philosophers lean toward pluralism. Should philosophers of science try to convince scientists to be more pluralistic? If we succeed, what impact would this shift have on science? It would not grind to a halt, but it would slow down appreciably. A better strategy would be to modify one's investigations depending on the current state of the area of science being investigated. If a plethora of respectable theories are available, then a bit of monism might be called for. As several authors point out, causal explanations need not be presented as exhaustive alternatives. In certain situations, one explanation is preferable. In other situations a second alternative will do the trick, and so on.

The second omission in this anthology concerns variability, multiplicity and the like. In fact, Longino is the only author that deals extensively with variation. Variation enters into these controversies in two ways -- first, as the presence of numerous alternative views and second, as phenomena that are intrinsically variable and must be variable to perform the functions that they do. For example, I have argued at some length that certain areas of science can profitably be construed as selection processes. Is selection the whole story? No, selection is only one of the processes that influences the course of science (recall the Darwin discussion), and selection requires variation. Regardless of how I might view science as a whole, I am a pluralist when it comes to selection.

One might conclude that adopting pluralism when it comes to selection is only a small step in the right direction, but it does go a way in rectifying the bias that we all seem to have with respect to multiplicity and variability. In response to the usual objections raised to "anything goes," Dickson remarks that a "multiplicity of dynamics is not necessarily a bad thing" (p. 57). Not necessarily a bad thing? It is not a bad thing at all. In fact, it is good. In his contribution Waters defends gene-centric views of evolution -- a position that is decidedly out of fashion among philosophers of biology -- but as far as the dispute over monism and pluralism is concerned, it is merely one more instance of pluralism. Waters remarks that scientists must be "tolerant of diversity" (p. 210). Tolerant? Diversity deserves more than "tolerance."


Werner Callebaut, 1993, Taking the Naturalistic Turn or How Real Philosophy of Science Is Done, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.