Scientific Understanding: Philosophical Perspectives

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Henk W. de Regt, Sabina Leonelli, and Kai Eigner (eds.), Scientific Understanding: Philosophical Perspectives, U. of Pittsburgh Press, 2009, 352pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780822943785.

Reviewed by Catherine Z. Elgin, Harvard University



Although understanding is widely believed to be a (if not the) central aim of science, the philosophy of science has had surprisingly little to say about what scientific understanding is. Scientific Understanding begins to remedy that lack. Consisting of papers first presented at a conference in Amsterdam in 2005, it takes up such topics as the relation between understanding and explanation, the ways models yield understanding, and the understandings afforded by different scientific disciplines. Rather than discuss every article, I will focus on some central themes.

Objectivity is a major concern. According to Hempel (1965), although understanding arises from explanation, it involves an additional element. Explanation is objective, Hempel believes, but the additional element is subjective — a feeling of grasping the connection between explanandum and explanans. Because of the allegedly subjective element, he consigns understanding to the psychological realm, denying it any epistemological status. All contributors to this volume agree that this is problematic. In ‘Understanding and Scientific Explanation’, Henk de Regt maintains that the added element is not a feeling, but a skill. For an explanatory theory to yield understanding, it must be intelligible, where intelligibility is what enables a scientist to ‘recognize the qualitative consequences of [the theory] without performing exact calculations’ (p. 33). Intelligibility, as de Regt construes it, is pragmatic. It involves a relation between an explanation or theory and an agent. An explanation or theory, he believes, conveys understanding only if the scientist can use it, where this involves skills and tacit knowledge, rather than just routine applications of algorithms.

Peter Lipton denies that explanation is necessary for understanding. He identifies four ways we gain scientific understanding without recourse to explanations. (1) An experiment can afford an understanding of the relation between a and b by disclosing that a causes b, even though it does not explain how or why a does so. (2) A thought experiment can provide understanding that something has to be so. Even if we do not know why gravitational acceleration and mass are independent, Galileo’s thought experiment demonstrates that they must be. (3) We have some understanding of a phenomenon when we see how it could have come about, whether or not it actually came about in the way we imagine. (4) Unification affords understanding. The recognition that the moon’s orbit and a falling apple are fundamentally the same sort of thing involves some understanding of gravity.

Being a cognitive accomplishment, understanding is psychological. Many follow Hempel and conclude that it is a subjective state, manifested in a sense of understanding with a distinctive phenomenological character. J. D. Trout (2002) and Petri Ylikoski regard the sense of understanding as pernicious, for such a feeling can readily mislead. Lipton and Stephen Grimm take a more positive view. Following Alison Gopnik (1998), they argue that the feeling of understanding can be a fallible, but genuine, indication that one actually does understand. It can therefore guide inquiry. If such a feeling is integral to understanding, then scientific understanding is partly subjective. But if the feeling is merely indicative of understanding, then the question of objectivity remains open, for there can easily be subjective indications of objective matters.

A critical question is how models embody and convey an understanding of their targets. The issue is a delicate one because models are often intentionally inaccurate. Margaret Morrison distinguishes between abstract models, which could not be realized in the physical world, and idealizations, which are simply approximations. She shows how the Hardy-Weinberg law, an abstraction, affords an understanding of the relation between heredity and genetic variation by describing the distribution of genes in an infinite population with random mating. The model reveals that selection can be understood as a population-level phenomenon, which is explained in terms of changing gene frequencies. We need not consider what is happening at the level of individual organisms. Details pertaining to selective mating in finite populations can thus be ignored with no sacrifice of understanding.

Falsifications of a different sort occur in simulations where there is no pretense that the program of the simulator is analogous, even in the limit, to features of the phenomena simulated. Such simulations might seem to be mere predictors, yielding little if any understanding. Doubtless some are. But in other cases, Johannes Lenhard maintains, we develop ‘a feeling for the consequences, an acquaintance with how the model functions’ (p. 182). Such a feeling is evidently a sort of tacit knowledge that enables us to think about the phenomena in terms of the features the model makes manifest. It is not clear whether we should call this understanding. If we do not, we may be at a loss to explain why the simulations yield good predictions; if we do, ‘simulations are surrogates for theories’ (p. 9).

The final section of the book concerns the understandings afforded by different scientific disciplines from physics and biology through engineering, economics, political theory, and history. These papers are valuable not only because of what they say concerning the specific disciplines they discuss but also because they problematize some of the sweeping claims typically made about science as a whole.

In ‘Understanding in the Engineering Sciences’, Mieke Boon notes that engineering’s understanding arises from a variety of different sciences, each with its own explanations, laws, and criteria of intelligibility. The sort of unification engineering science provides is not subsumption under common covering laws, but integration into interpretive structures that enable the contributions of physics, materials science, chemistry and so forth to complement one another. In engineering, practical applications are central. There is no hope of a purely semantic theory, with pragmatic applications a convenient afterthought. The question thus arises: is this true only for ‘applied sciences’, or is it true more generally?

In ‘Understanding in Political Science: The Plurality of Epistemic Interests’, Jeroen van Bouwel entertains the proposal that rational choice theory serves as the unifying theory for the social sciences. Those, like Michael Friedman (1974) and Philip Kitcher (1989), who consider unification critical for understanding, would presumably find such a move congenial. But van Bouwel argues convincingly that to accept a rational choice model would be to sacrifice important epistemic desiderata. He maintains that there are legitimate questions in political science that could not be adequately addressed within the framework of rational choice theory. He argues that scientific theories should be evaluated for both accuracy and adequacy. Accuracy is a measure of how well the theory explains the phenomena it concerns; adequacy is assessed by reference to the interests of those using the theory. The rational choice model may do well along the dimension of accuracy, but since it cannot accommodate the interests of agents who want an understanding that equips them to act effectively in the political arena, it fares badly in terms of adequacy. Again the pragmatic element is crucial. Political science ought not accept unification under the banner of rational choice theory, for such unification would prevent it from answering the questions that political scientists want to investigate and from generating an understanding capable of empowering political agents.

Similar concerns, Edwin Koster argues, arise in history, where we desire intentional explanations of individual actions and events. Even if it were possible to do so, forgoing intentional explanations of historical events in order to achieve a unified social science would be too costly. Such a social science would not yield the sort of understanding that historians seek.

Individually and collectively, the papers in this volume are valuable, but there are missed opportunities as well. The most glaring is that there is no explication of ‘understanding’ or of ‘scientific understanding’. One consequence is that the subjective character of understanding is simply conceded rather than argued for. Even though human subjects understand, it is not obvious that their accomplishment should be characterized as subjective. To see this we might note that understanding is closely related to knowledge. Although knowledge involves belief, no one is inclined to say that knowledge is merely psychological, not epistemological. No one holds that whether s knows that p is subjective. Why should understanding be different? Knowledge is related to justification, which typically relies on tacit background beliefs. But although people may think they know because they consider their justification and background beliefs adequate, they can be wrong, even if they satisfy the standards of their own epistemic community. If knowledge is not keyed to the standards of a particular, historically situated epistemic community, why should understanding be? Why shouldn’t we say that our predecessors thought they understood the motions of the planets, just as they thought they knew that the earth was motionless, but in both cases they were wrong? Whether s knows that p is independent of whether s feels that she knows that p. Again, why should understanding be different? There may be perfectly good answers to these sorts of questions. But there is no justification for simply assuming without argument that understanding is subjective, keyed to historical circumstances, and/or integrally related to the feeling of understanding, if indeed understanding has a distinctive feel.

Throughout the book, the contention that there is no algorithm for applications is used to buttress the claim that understanding is not objective. But algorithms are rare, and plenty of seemingly objective procedures do not involve algorithms. The assumption that only algorithmic processes are objective is doubtful at best.

The emphasis on pragmatics is important, but again is no bar to objectivity. Pragmatics is a question of use. But there are objective facts about what something can be used for. An empty shoe could be used to hammer a nail; an empty sock would be ineffective. Granted, the choice of ends to pursue may be subjective, or in the case of science, intersubjective. The community decides it wants to understand whether trench warfare is congenial to unofficial truces (p. 326) or how friction affects nanoscale molecular dynamics (p. 179), so its members investigate these rather than other questions. But once the problem has been set, there need be no further subjective element. The methodology of the relevant science specifies how such investigations are to be carried out and how the results are to be assessed. Scientific epistemology considers whether the methods and assessments are sound. Conclusions are of course fallible; mistakes have been made in the past and will no doubt be made in the future. But they do not show that the methods and assessments are less than objective; they only show that objectivity does not guarantee truth.

My objections are not criticisms of Scientific Understanding so much as a wish that the book had included more. With luck, it will inspire the contributors to this volume and other philosophers of science to investigate these matters further.


Friedman, Michael 1974, ‘Explanation and Scientific Understanding’, Journal of Philosophy 71:5-19.

Gopnik, Alison 1998, ‘Explanation as Orgasm’, Minds and Machines 8:101-118.

Hempel, C. G. 1965, Aspects of Scientific Explanation and Other Essays, New York: Free Press.

Kitcher, Philip 1989, ‘Explanatory Unification and the Causal Structure of the World’ in Scientific Explanation, edited by Philip Kitcher and Wesley Salmon, Minneapolis: U. of Minnesota Press, pp. 410-505.

Trout, J. D. 2002, ‘Scientific Explanation and the Sense of Understanding’, Philosophy of Science 69:212-233.