Scientific Values and Civic Virtues

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Noretta Koertge (ed.), Scientific Values and Civic Virtues, Oxford University Press, 2005, 256 pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195172248.

Reviewed by Steve Fuller, University of Warwick


The contributors to this volume consist of some veterans of the Science Wars over the past fifteen years, including the editor, Gerald Holton, and Paul Gross. Some pieces demonize the quite different senses of "fundamentalism" on offer in contemporary Christianity, Islam, and Hinduism -- each of which supposedly threatens the future of science. What distinguishes this volume from one that might have appeared in the wake of the Sokal Hoax ten years ago is a shift in emphasis from the physical to the biological sciences. Perhaps because of the directness with which biology impinges on human life in both its research practices and wider applications, several contributors dwell on the idea that good science presupposes that scientists are of good character. This presupposition supposedly allows a democratic society to trust scientists to manage their own affairs so as to promote the public interest by the principled search for the truth.

The movement of epistemic standards closer to moral virtue reflects a worrisome trend in the recent renascence of naturalism in philosophy that links access to truth with a deepening sense of the knower's history. While it is relatively harmless to insist that mastery of a scientific specialty requires training in certain techniques, it is more problematic (pace Kuhn) to insist that all such specialists share the same disciplinary narrative -- and still more problematic to require that they pledge allegiance to the same philosophical world-view, say, what the US National Academy of Sciences calls "methodological naturalism." It makes for bad philosophy, bad science, and bad politics. Yet, we seem to be sliding down this slippery slope, which in the past has led to loyalty oaths and in the future could lead to the genetic profiling of people as unfit for scientific endeavors because of their propensity to belief in, say, the supernatural.

The book's title is meant to evoke Karl Popper's "open society," in which "scientific values" and "civic virtues" are two expressions of the same democratic ideal. In the history of political thought, this is called "republicanism." As Hegel made clear, republicanism aims to keep the best and reject the worst of both liberalism and communitarianism. It promotes both individualism without negligence and collectivism without conformity. In scientific terms, republicanism proposes a "unity of science," a body of universal knowledge that is greater than the sum of its disciplinary parts because science is conducted not only by specialists but also, and more importantly, on behalf of everyone. This attractive ideal informed a wide range of projects -- including Hegel's, Comte's, and Neurath's -- that philosophers nowadays prefer to consign to the dustbin of history because of their embarrassing scientific and political products. But no matter how much the contributors to this book may wish to distance themselves from these projects, they are going down the same path. I say this with some initial enthusiasm, since my own version of social epistemology does so too.

Perhaps the volume's strongest suit is that it does not feature arguments to the following effect: (a) That the science-politics relationship is so contingent that it makes no sense to prescribe common norms that might coordinate, if not outright regulate, the two activities. (b) That the research and educational agendas of democratic societies should be turned over to scientific specialists, by virtue of their superior knowledge, so to prevent society from egregious error. (c) That democratic societies should simply be allowed to support whatever forms of knowledge they wish to live with, for as long as they wish to live with them. To this reviewer, the absence of (b)-style arguments is the surest sign that the contributors, despite their uniformly establishmentarian scientific sympathies, are still republicans -- and not authoritarians. It will be interesting to see whether a successor volume still holds fast to this ideal, since some contributors seem to be chomping at the bit to grant authorized scientists unilateral control over the science curriculum.

Here the US context for the volume is significant. Until the establishment of the National Science Foundation (NSF) after World War II, the United States was unique in its promotion of knowledge without any central authorization. In a true test of the republican ideal, the US Constitution delegates educational responsibility to the state and local school boards and provides for a Patent Office to register inventions, but no national universities to generate them. Indeed, the NSF would probably not exist in its current form, had the threat to national security from the Soviet Union not been presented as both total and science-led. I stress this point because readers outside the US sympathetic to this volume's general stance have easier recourse to (b)-style arguments through national education and research ministries that have virtually merged scientific and political establishments.

Civic republican attempts to sublate the dialectic of liberalism and communitarianism can generate a bipolar disorder, one very evident in the history of American knowledge politics, which has veered between a Whitmanesque tolerance of endless difference and a Puritanical paranoia about contamination from foreign agents. (Those interested in the course of this dialectic should peruse the works of Richard Hofstadter.) Science thus appears both all-encompassing and all-protecting, reflecting, on the one hand, the embrace of interdisciplinarity and multiculturalism and, on the other hand, the fear of world communism and religious fundamentalism. The US is the world's undisputed leader in both poles of this dialectic. John Dewey is the consummate American philosopher because his thought and action are so easily captured in these terms: Dewey, who never fully detached epistemic foundationalism from its historic associations with organized religion, was one of the leading advocates of universal science education as a blending agent in the American melting pot.

The political deformation of Dewey's ambivalence has been recently documented in George Reisch's How the Cold War Transformed Philosophy of Science (Cambridge, 2005). Of relevance to the volume under review is Dewey's student, Sidney Hook, who acquired a second-order version of the American bipolar disorder. He swung from sympathy for Marxist revolutionary politics to vehemence in his denunciation of anything even vaguely associated with the Soviet Union. At both ends of this ideological journey, he found himself at odds with liberal socialists like Bertrand Russell and the émigré positivists from the Vienna Circle. I mention Hook because his work is the specialty of Barbara Forrest, who figures in this volume as the most diligent student of the Christian fundamentalist motivations of those who would promote creationism and intelligent design in the US high school science curriculum. Where Hook, via the Congress for Cultural Freedom, found "Reds" under the bed, Forrest, via the National Centre for Science Education, finds "Creds" (i.e., religious believers).

Forrest's research was pivotal in the recent court case, Kitzmiller v. Dover Area School District, which outlawed the teaching of intelligent design in science classes. The details of that research are represented well here in an article co-authored with Paul Gross. Forrest's effectiveness was reflected in the presiding judge's interpretation of the US Constitution's separation of Church and State doctrine in Puritanical rather than Whitmanesque terms: He went beyond ruling that a religiously inspired viewpoint should not dominate the public school curriculum to pronouncing that no such viewpoint whatsoever should ever be introduced into scientific matters. Why science, as opposed to other subjects in the curriculum, should be treated so preciously remained unaddressed. However, it would make sense if a certain self-consciously non-theological conception of science were treated as a secular religion of a civic republican polity, as Dewey seemed to wish for the United States.

Sanctifying science in the manner just suggested tempts one to subject scientists to exaggerated moral scrutiny. Michael Ruse's piece may be read as trying to safeguard against that fate. In this context, Ruse unsurprisingly has become a convert to the idea that "trust" is a valuable epistemic concept, perhaps the normative glue that holds together science as a social enterprise. He reprises various cases from the history of modern biology that, in some sense or other, might be seen as having involved violations of trust: trust in authorship, competence, authenticity, originality, etc. The most striking case is that of Theodosius Dobzhansky, arguably the principal architect of the Neo-Darwinian synthesis. Dobzhansky's success supposedly lay in his training in the two most polarized branches of biology required to forge the synthesis, natural history and experimental genetics. Ruse shows, however, that Dobzhansky was more a jack than a master of trades who appropriated Sewall Wright's population reasoning without much acknowledgement or even comprehension. Dobzhansky's tireless data gathering was also sloppy and unreliable. Moreover, all of this was an open secret among biologists. Nevertheless, Dobzhansky passed without shame or rebuke because he was seen as having forged a whole much greater than its suboptimal parts.

Was this response the right one? Ruse refuses to pass judgment on Dobzhansky because he is more concerned with the more general question of why alleged trust violations in science are not prosecuted more vigorously. Because such allegations are usually aimed at very accomplished practitioners, argues Ruse, scientists suspect the settling of scores and hence question the motives of the accusers. But Ruse also argues that trust is so sacred in science that the very thought of its violation conjures up a sense of inhumanity comparable to the disgust felt about sexual perversion. Behind this melodramatic diagnosis lurks a sensible observation: The discovery of any kind of fraud offends the scientist's sense of fair play. But is any specifically epistemic damage done by scientists misrepresenting their activities?

Once demystified, "trust" is simply the conversion of a liability into a virtue: It doesn't matter that we lack the time or skill to check our colleagues because (so trust-mongers argue) we don't need to. There are two general reasons why this might well be true: either our colleagues usually represent themselves correctly (and when they don't, they are eventually caught) or it usually doesn't matter whether they represent themselves correctly (and when it does matter, they are eventually caught). Philosophers should take the latter possibility seriously, since the more popular former option amounts to wishful thinking, i.e., a belief in its truth discourages any further scrutiny. And given the hostility to religiously inspired knowledge claims displayed in this volume, the contributors should not wish to stand accused of harbouring superstitious attitudes toward science itself.

The metaphysically deepest reason why the misrepresentation of knowledge claims might not matter is that reality is somehow coarser-grained than our ability to represent it. We draw many true-false distinctions to which reality is indifferent and so, if we don't check or provide the means for checking, reality tolerates either side of the distinction. This may be seen as a realist way of capturing the antirealist's position. I happen to hold this position, but even full-blooded realists should appreciate why the preoccupation with research fraud might be overblown. After all, those guilty of such fraud often reached substantially the right results but by empirically devious means, what in a more polite philosophical time had been called "intellectual intuition."

For example, Ruse suggests that Mendel's laws of heredity may have been derived from data too good to be true. Our willingness to excuse Mendel rests on the subsequent history of genetics, most of which did not involve Mendel at all. However, as Paul Feyerabend argued with respect to Galileo's similar malfeasance, any lingering resentment to Mendel merely reflects a preference to have science get to the truth by the right means rather than to get to the truth at all. For his own part, rather than try Galileo and Mendel, Feyerabend would call them as witnesses in a trial over the inviolability of the scientific method, especially when interpreted in excessively empiricist terms. Even those reluctant to follow Feyerabend's lead here are forced to confront a tension between truth and method in science analogous to what political philosophers routinely face between morality and law.

The best response to the Feyerabendian challenge is a genuinely civic republican one: Adherence to the scientific method is the best overall strategy to enable the entire polity to reach the truth in a timely fashion -- that is, without too few running ahead of too many, which could easily create the conditions for either dominance from above or revolt from below. In effect, the scientific method amounts to an epistemic welfare policy that redistributes advantage from the quick- to the dull-witted to allow the most people to make the most use of the most knowledge. This staggering of the pace of scientific innovation is out of respect for our common humanity, which prevails over particular individuals' desire to jump ahead of the pack. Such a policy deserves the name "epistemic justice." To be clear, "humanity" in this sense is defined in primarily epistemic, not moral, terms: i.e., the capacity of every human to understand and, under the right circumstances, to have made a given scientific discovery. Thus, the appeal to method is designed to undercut the significance accorded to priority and originality, the two legal bases for lodging intellectual property claims in our times.

Whatever else may be true about the original eighteenth-century Enlightenment, it was not a rearguard action motivated by fear without any positive proposal for the future. Yet, the contributors to this book, while frequently invoking the Enlightenment, stick to its letter at the expense of its spirit. You would never guess from these pages that the Enlightenment was the product of intellectuals who availed themselves of a range of literary genres, not least those that routinely blurred fact and fiction (e.g., "philosophical history" and, of course, satire) in a concerted effort to undermine academic authority. (Indeed, Phillip Sullivan, drawing on the anti-Foucaultian historian, Keith Windschuttle, argues the contrary thesis.) Moreover, you would never guess that the Enlightenment was at least as much about expanding the range of people authorized to make knowledge claims as promulgating already accepted truths.

Rather, the above points are associated with an allegedly anti-Enlightenment movement called "postmodernism" whose self-declared radicalism has recently included making common cause with various forms of religious "fundamentalism" in trying to undermine the authority of science. Clearly lost on the contributors to this volume is the synergy that the original Enlightenment enjoyed with the first wave of evangelism, what in the American colonies was called the "Great Awakening." It was perhaps best epitomized in the career of that controversial polymath, the natural philosopher and theologian, Joseph Priestley. Of more contemporary importance is that an opportunity to rekindle that synergy remains in the two-thirds of Americans who claim to believe in both divine creation and evolution.